Epistemic Angst: Radical Skepticism and the Groundlessness of Our Believing

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Duncan Pritchard, Epistemic Angst: Radical Skepticism and the Groundlessness of Our Believing, Princeton University Press, 2016, 239pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691167237.

Reviewed by Annalisa Coliva, University of California, Irvine


Duncan Pritchard has written an ambitious and thought-provoking book, which aims to integrate elements of Ludwig Wittgenstein's On Certainty and of John McDowell's disjunctivism to provide a solution to the problem of external world skepticism. Indeed, it is a significant contribution to the rising trend of "hinge epistemology".[1] A trend that, as the label suggests, aims to develop a Wittgenstein-inspired epistemology.

Pritchard's dialectical setup will be familiar to connoisseurs of hinge epistemology. For he contends that scepticism should be understood as a paradox, which, starting with prima facie acceptable premises, leads to the unacceptable conclusion that we do not possess knowledge of ordinary empirical propositions about mid-size physical objects in our surroundings. Moreover, Pritchard thinks that the paradox in fact comes in two distinct forms, which he calls the 'Closure-based paradox' and the 'Underdetermination-based paradox'.[2] He thinks that these paradoxes put under pressure our notion of knowledge, rather than that of warrant or justification, despite what other hinge epistemologists have maintained. Yet, he rightly notices that the kind of knowledge targeted by these paradoxes is one that entails having rationally grounded or supported belief. Hence, that it is a notion of knowledge, which, like any epistemically internalist notion, does not sever the connection between its obtaining and its reflective accessibility to a subject. Like other hinge epistemologists, Pritchard notices that crudely externalist responses are impotent vis-à-vis either form of sceptical paradox. For either they simply do not address the internalist notion of knowledge that gives rise to them or else they must be revisionary of the idea, which Pritchard justly sees as ingrained in our common linguistic and epistemic practices, that knowledge and having rational support for what one in fact knows can, and often do obtain together. Finally, like several other hinge epistemologists, Pritchard favors an "undercutting" anti-skeptical strategy to an "overriding" one, and aims to show that these two sceptical paradoxes are in fact based on a philosophically loaded and contentious understanding of the relevant concepts and epistemic practices.[3]

The main elements of novelty in Pritchard's version of hinge epistemology are his defence of the Closure Principle and his claim that there is nothing in On Certainty that could speak to the Underdetermination-based version of the sceptical paradox. This shortcoming, in its turn, motivates Pritchard's third main innovative move: the endorsement of epistemological disjunctivism. For, according to him, while Wittgenstein's views, once suitably developed, can take care of Closure-based scepticism, epistemological disjunctivism is called for to address the other form of the paradox. Finally, claims Pritchard, once these two paradoxes are solved in the ways proposed, it could actually be shown that, far from being in stark contrast, as most epistemologists would have it, hinge epistemology and disjunctivism can in fact lend support to each other. For, on the one hand, the Wittgensteinian strand shows the locality of epistemic evaluation and therefore sets the boundaries within which the factive rational support for our beliefs disjunctivists hold we have can in fact obtain. On the other, and as already stated, disjunctivism supplements hinge epistemology by providing it with the means to deal with Underdetermination-based scepticism.

Along the way, Pritchard also provides a number of interesting discussions of, and comparisons with other important proposals, such as Wright's, Strawson's, Michael Williams', Davidson's, contrastivism, dogmatism and rational support contextualism. He also engages in debate with various Wittgensteinian scholars, especially with respect to the status of what he calls "hinge commitments".

In the remainder of this note, I will focus on some of the highly original aspects of Pritchard's intriguing proposal. My observations are mainly discussion points between supporters of hinge epistemology, but I hope they will be of interest to all readers interested in the topic of scepticism.

It is a well-known consequence of Wittgenstein's epistemology that it gives rise to what seems, at least prima facie, a denial of the Closure principle for knowledge and other epistemic operators such as evidential warrant or justification. For, given the locality of reasons, we can know (or justifiably believe), according to Wittgenstein, ordinary empirical propositions about mid-size objects in our surroundings, but we cannot know the "heavy-weight" implications of those propositions, such as "I am not a BIV" or "There is an external world", on which the very possibility of knowing ordinary empirical propositions depends. Several hinge epistemologists are prepared to face the situation, offering considerations to minimize the allegedly devastating effects of such an admission. Some, for instance, are willing to grant that Closure does not fail for other epistemic notions in the vicinity.[4] Others point out that it would fail, for principled reasons, only when the consequent of the conditional is a heavy-weight implication, but not when it is any other ordinary empirical proposition. Hence, its limited failure would be compatible with the retention of that very principle in all those cases in which we do in fact need it in order to explain how we can extend our knowledge (or justified belief) from one ordinary empirical proposition to the consequent of a known entailment, which has the former proposition as its antecedent.[5]

Pritchard, in contrast, wants to maintain the unconditional validity of the Closure principle and yet, with Wittgenstein, he does not want to say that we can know heavy-weight assumptions, which are nevertheless entailed by ordinary empirical propositions we know. His way out of this impasse consists in claiming that our attitude towards these assumptions is not one of belief and that we would never acquire such a belief because of an application of the Closure principle. Since belief is necessary for knowledge, it follows that the Closure principle is simply not applicable in those cases in which the consequent of the known conditional is a "heavy-weight" proposition, or, as Pritchard prefers to call it, a "hinge commitment".

This is all very good, still, more could be said about the kind of attitude we actually have towards these peculiar propositions, if it is not one of belief. To be reminded, in a Wittgensteinian spirit, that we bear to them a kind of animal, visceral certainty is fine as far as it goes, but it should not obscure the fact that we can and do conceptualize them and that they can become objects of some kind of propositional attitude after all. Moreover, I think it would be useful to be more explicit about how this move would block the usual kinds of criticism levelled against deniers of Closure. For, if "There is an external world" is a proposition and, as such, it is knowledgeably entailed by "Here is a hand", as Pritchard grants, how come that we can know that we have a hand and yet not know that there is an external world? In fact, how come that we can know we have a hand and yet not even be allowed to form a belief with respect to "There is an external world", which is a proposition we know to be entailed by "Here is a hand"? Similarly, it would help to be more explicit about how the proposal fares with respect to the charge of licensing "abominable conjunctions"[6] such as "I know I have a hand but I don't know there is an external world". My hunch is that, in the end, Pritchard will have to concur with other hinge epistemologists that the scope of the Closure principle is limited to known entailments flagging ordinary empirical propositions on both sides of the conditional, or, more generally, propositions which are not hinge commitments and can therefore be known and consequently (justifiably) believed.

The other issue I would like to consider is whether it is really the case that Wittgenstein's remarks in On Certainty do not provide us with any useful element to counter Underdetermination-based scepticism. Pritchard painstakingly discusses this form of sceptical paradox. Here I will just offer a broad-brush characterization of it. If you hold that it is possible for a subject to have the same kind of evidence irrespective of whether she is actually perceiving a hand in front of her, or whether she is merely hallucinating having one, it follows that, whatever is rationally available to a subject actually falls short of providing her with knowledge of (or justified belief in) "Here is my hand". Now, Wittgenstein's own insistence on the locality of reasons is matched by the idea that knowledge and justification do take place, but within a system of assumptions (or hinge commitments, if you will). The latter are not themselves known or justified, yet stand fast for all of us and actually allow us to form justified beliefs and to gain knowledge of (among others) ordinary empirical propositions about mid-size physical objects. Hence, on this reading of Wittgenstein's remarks in On Certainty, he would not be rejecting the idea that perceptual experiences are in principle indistinguishable whatever their causal origin might be. Yet, he would offer us considerations in favour of the idea that these experiences take place within a system of hinge commitments, which are actually unassailable by sceptical attacks, and that allow us to acquire justification and knowledge about physical objects in our surroundings. In other words, once one is willing, as Pritchard is, to buy into the idea of hinge commitments, which are impervious to sceptical assaults, then there seem to be enough elements in Wittgenstein's On Certainty to counter Underdetermination-based scepticism too. Furthermore, on this picture one can actually offer one's perceptions as reasons in support of one's claim that, say, there is a robin on a tree. For, given one's available evidence and the suitable hinge commitments, one can trust one's senses, absent other defeaters, and justifiably believe that there is a robin on a tree in virtue of one's current perceptions. Hence, it would be interesting to know whether Pritchard disagrees with this reading of On Certainty, or else why he thinks it would be silent vis-à-vis this kind of paradox.

Still, let us assume for the sake of the argument that one needs to supplement Wittgenstein's position considerably in order to confront that paradox. The question now is whether epistemological disjunctivism would really help. Surely, epistemological disjunctivism can easily explain the commonsensical intuition that we justify our claims regarding specific physical objects in our surroundings by saying "Because I see that such-and-so". As we saw, however, a Wittgenstein-inspired view would be equally well placed to explain that intuition. Hence, that consideration is not enough to motivate the endorsement of disjunctivism. Pritchard then claims that when one is actually seeing a robin on a tree, say, one would be able to favour the good-case scenario over a bad one, by appealing to further considerations regarding the absence of defeaters. So one would be able to favour the former scenario even if one could not perceptually tell the difference between the two cases. While we should happily grant all that, these further considerations, as Pritchard notices, would be impotent to help one dismiss a radically sceptical scenario, since they would be compatible with the obtaining of that scenario. Hence, according to Pritchard, we should remember that radically sceptical hypotheses are "by their nature bare -- that is, rationally unmotivated -- error possibilities" (p. 140), to which we can respond just by appealing to the fact that we are seeing a robin on a tree. Still, we cannot thereby conclude that we know the denial of radically anti-sceptical hypotheses. Here -- I take it -- is where Wittgenstein's considerations become germane again, for it is only by reverting to them that radically sceptical scenarios can be dismissed and yet we do not reach a position where we can actually know their denial.

The worry, however, is that responding this way to the Underdetermination-based sceptical paradox is dialectically suspicious. For either there is no such radically sceptical paradox at all, or else there is a radically sceptical paradox, which is different from its Closure-based counterpart, and that crucially depends on the indistinguishability thesis. If the former is the case, disjunctivism is right to respond that we may appeal to various considerations concerning the absence of defeaters to favour a good-case scenario, even if it is subjectively indistinguishable from a bad-case one. In the latter case, in contrast, the paradox cannot be dispelled by appealing to further considerations regarding the absence of defeaters and disjunctivism turns out to be unable to respond to it. Indeed, all the anti-sceptical work seems to be done by Wittgenstein-inspired considerations regarding the dubiously rational status of sceptical hypotheses.

One might then appeal to a more traditional variant of disjunctivism, which incorporates the claim Pritchard is uncommittal about that perceptions and delusionary experiences are metaphysically distinct mental states. By so doing, one may hold that, in the good case, one does have perceptual evidence, and hence knows that there is a robin on a tree, while in the bad case one has neither the former evidence nor the latter knowledge. One might then hold that, in the good case, one would thereby also know that one is not a BIV, even if one is unable to tell how one knows, or else tell a story as to why the entailment does not hold. Yet, it should be noted that the former horn would conflict with the desirable connection between knowledge and its rational availability to a subject. The latter, in contrast, would be based on a rejection of the unrestricted validity of Closure. Hence, either disjunctivism is impotent vis-à-vis radically sceptical paradoxes or else the two paradoxes -- the one based on Underdetermination and the one based on Closure -- turn out to be more intertwined than one might have at first supposed.

Pritchard's engaging book is a heterodox and highly thought-provoking contribution to hinge epistemology -- one, which, no doubt, will have a great impact on that current -- and it is a must-read for anyone interested in epistemology.

[1] Early examples of it are Wright, C. "Facts and certainty", Proceedings of the British Academy, 71, 1985, pp. 429-72; and "Warrant for nothing (and foundations for free)?", The Supplementary Volume of the Aristotelian Society, 78, 2004, pp. 167-212. Strawson, P. Skepticism and Naturalism. Some Varieties, Columbia University Press, 1985. Williams, M. Unnatural Doubts, Blackwell, 1991. More recent ones are Coliva, A. Extended Rationality. A Hinge Epistemology, Palgrave, 2015, and Coliva, A. & Moyal-Sharrock, D. (eds) Hinge Epistemology, Brill, 2016.

[2] Pritchard's two paradoxes are roughly equivalent to the Cartesian and the Humean paradoxes highlighted by Wright (1985, 2004). Pritchard argues that the two paradoxes significantly differ and that they call for rather distinct solutions. Wright, in contrast, contends that despite their differences they depend on a common lacuna in the sceptical reasoning and hence call for a unified solution.

[3] Overriding responses, in contrast, according to Pritchard, would aim to revise the relevant concepts.

[4] See Wright 2004, in Wright, C. "On epistemic entitlement (II): welfare state epistemology", in D. Dodd & E. Zardini (eds.) Scepticism and Perceptual Justification, Oxford, 2012, pp. 213-247. He actually endorses the view that Closure does not fail for warrant and that we can therefore augment the initial rational support we have for "There is an external world" -- which is merely a kind of non-evidential warrant -- going through a Moore-style argument, starting with the evidentially warranted premise that here is one's hand.

[5] See Coliva 2015.

[6] See DeRose, K. "Solving the sceptical problem", Philosophical Review 104/1, 1995, pp. 1-52.