Epistemic Authority: A Theory of Trust, Authority, and Autonomy in Belief

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Linda Trinkaus Zagzebski, Epistemic Authority: A Theory of Trust, Authority, and Autonomy in Belief, Oxford University Press, 2012, 279pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199936472.

Reviewed by Anne Baril, University of New Mexico


Linda Zagzebski offers an argument for epistemic authority that is meant to be compatible with assumptions and values that are widely accepted in modern liberal societies. (106) Proceeding "wholly [from] the point of view of the subject -- a self-reflective person who asks herself how she should get beliefs she accepts upon reflection," (2) Zagzebski concludes that "the self-reflective person is committed to belief on authority." (3) This rich book includes important contributions to a number of central topics in epistemology.[1] In what follows, I will restrict myself to a brief summary and critique of the central argument for epistemic authority.

The argument proceeds in four stages. First, Zagzebski aims to establish that "epistemic self-trust is both rational and inescapable." (3) She begins by noting that we have a natural, prereflective trust in our own faculties, where the state of trust is a hybrid of epistemic, affective, and behavioral components. (37) When I trust my faculties:

1. I believe my faculties will get me the truth.

2. I feel a trusting emotion that my faculties will get me the truth.

3. I treat my faculties as if they will get me to the truth. (37-8)

Zagzebski argues that this trust is rational upon reflection. Her argument depends heavily on her understanding of rationality as "doing a better job of what we naturally do" (45):

Rationality is a property we have when we do what we do naturally, only we do a better job of it. To be rational is to do a better job of what we do in any case -- what our faculties do naturally. (30)

One thing we do naturally, she says, is try to resolve dissonance, where dissonance is experienced conflict, not only among our beliefs, but among our mental states more generally: our beliefs, emotions, desires, and decisions. (29) We experience dissonance when beliefs conflict, when desires conflict, and when beliefs conflict with desires (as when "I believe that I will go on a trip tomorrow, but I do not want to go" (31)). Sometimes conflict between our mental states is resolved unconsciously and without effort -- for example, when I give up my belief that I turned off the watering system when I hear the sprinklers turn on. (30) This natural, unconscious resolution of dissonance gives us a model for the rational response to dissonance that cannot be so easily resolved, including the dissonance that arises when we confront the problem of epistemic circularity: the problem that we have no way of telling whether our perceptions, memories, and so on are reliably accurate without depending on those same perceptions, memories, and so on. (38-43)

Zagzebski argues that the most rational response to epistemic circularity is to have a general trust in our faculties, (49) because "reflective self-trust [best] resolves the dissonance we have when we discover epistemic circularity, and that seems to me to be rational." (43) Any other response to the problem of epistemic circularity (for example, believing my faculties are not trustworthy while acting as if they are, or believing that they are trustworthy while feeling doubt that they are) creates more dissonance, and is thus not rational. (44) (Extreme skepticism, while perhaps minimally consistent, is not rational because rationality is doing a better job of what we do naturally, and the skeptic is not doing what we do naturally. (45)) Zagzebski occasionally gives us a glimpse of the shape that she thinks the harmonious life will have (201-202, 251-254), but she mostly remains neutral, simply saying that we need to place trust in our faculties if we are "to lead a normal life." (86) She concludes that we are rationally required to trust in our faculties -- and especially so when we are conscientious in our exercise of them. (48-49)

The second stage in Zagzebski's argument for epistemic authority is to establish that we are rationally required to trust others' faculties, and other people more generally. Her argument is one of consistency. We're rationally committed to trusting ourselves (as she has just argued); we're rationally committed to treat like cases alike; others are relevantly like us in terms of their faculties (their faculties being akin to the very faculties we trust in ourselves); and so we're rationally committed to trusting others as well: "the general trust I have in myself commits me to a presumption in favor of the belief of any other person." (69)

The mere fact that another person believes p, Zagzebski claims, always gives me pro tanto defeasible reason to believe p, and an even stronger pro tanto reason to believe p when I conscientiously believe they are conscientious (57).[2]

The third stage in the argument is to establish that among those we are committed to trusting are some whom we ought to treat as epistemic authorities. (3) An epistemic authority in a domain is a person (or an object (119), or even a strategy (115)) a conscientious person will let 'stand in for' her in her attempt to get the truth in that domain. (105) She models her account of epistemic authority on Joseph Raz's account of political authority, giving epistemic analogues of Raz's conditions on political authority. To mention two of these conditions:[3]

Preemption: "The fact that an authority has a belief p is a reason for me to believe p that replaces my other reasons relevant to believing p and is not simply added to them." (107)

Content-independence: My reason for adopting the authority's belief is not dependent on the content of that belief; if he/she/it had believed q instead of p, I would have reason to believe q instead of p. (107)

What justifies the authority of another person's belief for me, according to Zagzebski, is "my conscientious judgment that I am more likely to form a belief that survives my conscientious self-reflection if I believe what the authority believes than if I try to figure out what to believe myself." (This is the "Normal Justification Thesis", pp. 110-111) Zagzebski thinks that even instruments such as thermometers and GPS systems are authorities in this sense. The "more interesting" case of epistemic authority is one in which we believe something (preemptively, content-independently, etc.) not just because another believes it, but because they tell us so. (119) We may call the former doxastic authority, and the latter testimonial authority.

For it to be reasonable to defer to another's testimonial authority, we need trust not only in the speaker's accuracy, but also in her sincerity. Zagzebski argues that, just as we have pro tanto reason to trust another's accuracy, we also have a pro tanto reason to trust the speaker's sincerity. Her argument for the latter is analogous to her earlier argument for the former: if I naturally speak the truth, and only do otherwise for special reason, and if I conscientiously believe that others are basically similar to me in their natural dispositions, then I have pro tanto reason to think that others also will naturally speak what they take to be the truth, and do otherwise only for special reasons. (127) Zagzebski concludes that it can be reasonable to believe p based on another's testimony that p. For there to be legitimate testimonial authority, the telling must satisfy analogues of the conditions on doxastic authority. The authority of another person's testimony for me is justified by my conscientious judgment that (and ultimately by the fact that (138)) if I believe what the authority tells me (and believe it preemptively, content-independently, etc.), the result will survive my conscientious self-reflection better than if I try to figure out what to believe myself. (133) (The "result" language is intentionally ambiguous between epistemic and non-epistemic 'results;' see 149-151.) There are tellings that satisfy this condition (132), and thus there is a strong kind of epistemic authority, an authority which -- like the political authority on which it is modeled -- is compatible with our modern values of egalitarianism and autonomy, when these values are properly understood (see especially Chapter 1 and 11).

The fourth and final stage in Zagzebski's argument for epistemic authority is to extend the model: to communities (155), to those trusted by those we and our communities conscientiously trust (152), and to moral and religious authorities (160, 199). An epistemic authority can be a religious community, rather than an individual, and can be distant in time and space. (122) Her argument thus has far greater practical import than it would were epistemic authorities to be found only among those individuals with whom we have direct, face-to-face interaction.

To re-cap the main thread of the argument: 1) epistemic self-trust is both rational and inescapable, 2) consistent self-trust commits us to trust in others, 3) among those we are committed to trusting are some we ought to treat as epistemic authorities, and 4) some of these authorities can be in the moral and religious domains. (3) Zagzebski concludes that there is epistemic authority in a strong sense -- an epistemic authority that "has all of the essential features of practical authority" (139) (though at times she seems to make concessions that suggest a more moderate position; see, e.g., 116-117).

Zagzebski's argument is characteristically clear and compelling, but, like any interesting argument, controversial. In the space remaining I will note a few reservations about her understanding of rationality, and the role it plays in her argument.

Zagzebski argues that epistemic self-trust is rational because it is needed to resolve dissonance. (50) There are at least three kinds of dissonance that she proposes that rationality involves resolving: 1) dissonance among beliefs, 2) dissonance among beliefs, emotions, and actions, and 3) dissonance between, on the one hand, beliefs (and, I believe, also emotions and actions) and, on the other hand, desires (31). As accounts of rationality, I find each proposal increasingly problematic. And since her argument for epistemic authority seems to depend on her claim that epistemic self-trust is rational not only in the first sense, but also in the second and third senses, my worries about her account of rationality, if merited, threaten not only her account of rationality, but her defense of epistemic authority.

One sort of dissonance it is rational to resolve, by Zagzebski's account, is dissonance among beliefs. We might object to even this relatively modest account of rationality, on the grounds that the most rational response to dissonance among beliefs isn't always to resolve that dissonance.[4] But according to Zagzebski, epistemic self-trust (which itself comprises epistemic, emotional, and behavioral elements) is rational not merely in that it resolves dissonance among beliefs, but in that it resolves dissonance among mental states more generally. (43-45, 47, 190) She proposes that a person is less rational to the extent that her beliefs, actions, and emotions (especially her feelings of trust) are not in harmony. (44)

But it seems to me perfectly rational that we should continue to act as if our faculties are getting the truth, and feel trusting of them, even if upon reflection we don't believe they are getting the truth. By way of analogy, consider what is the practically rational response when we learn surprising things about the world, such as the fact that apparently solid objects are mostly empty space. It seems to me perfectly practically rational to act as if such objects are as solid as they appear, and to feel trusting in their apparent solidity, even if, when I reflect, I don't believe that they are solid (at least, not in the way they appear to be). Likewise, it seems perfectly rational to me for a person to continue to act as if her faculties are trustworthy, even if upon reflection she concludes that she cannot justifiably believe that they are.

This certainly seems more rational than -- as Zagzebski seems to propose -- changing one's belief to 'fit' one's behavior, for the sake of psychological harmony. This wouldn't reflect the special status that epistemic considerations have in our cognitive economy. Someone who believes something for which she lacks good evidence, for the sake of psychological comfort (such as Stella, who refuses to believe Blanche's claim that she was raped by Stella's husband), is less rational -- paradigmatically so -- than one who accepts the fact and attempts to deal with it. The same, mutatis mutandis, when it comes to someone who changes her beliefs for the sake of psychological harmony.

We should also be skeptical of the proposal that a person who experiences dissonance between her beliefs and desires is thereby less rational. Is a person who believes there is a war, and hates that there is a war, really less rational than a person who resolves this dissonance by somehow managing to get rid of her belief that there is a war, or changing her feelings about war? Zagzebski says that the resolution of this kind of dissonance is less pressing than other species -- that we can "get along well enough with the dissonance." But she still claims that "nonetheless, it is better if dissonance is resolved" and that the harmony that results from unconscious resolution of conflict between desires, or between a belief and a desire "gives us a model of the kind of rationality that is desirable for the same reason we desire harmony in our beliefs: We naturally desire and attempt to achieve a harmonious self." (31) But (granting that the alleged dissonance is best described as a dissonance between belief and desire, rather than between, say, world and mind) does this kind of dissonance really call for resolution at all?

Note that these objections do not trade on replacing the 'broad' rationality that Zagzebski is interested in with a 'narrow' understanding of rationality, where only cognitive states can be evaluated as rational or irrational. (30, 44) Even one who grants that aims, values, and emotions play an important role in forming beliefs, and ultimately in assessments of a being's rationality,[5] may be skeptical that a person is any less rational for failing to resolve dissonance between her mental states in the way Zagzebski proposes.

Two further reservations arise from the way Zagzebski employs this understanding of rationality in her argument for epistemic authority. The first concerns her argument from self-trust to other-trust. Zagzebski bases her conclusion that we should trust ourselves on the grounds that we will experience psychic dissonance if we don't. She concludes that since we trust ourselves, we should trust others who are similar in the relevant respects (especially with respect to their faculties): "If I have a general trust in myself and I accept the principle that I should treat like cases alike, I am rationally committed to having a general trust in them also." (55) But when we understand the sense in which Zagzebski holds that it is rational to trust ourselves, this conclusion doesn't seem to follow. To illustrate: imagine that you trust yourself because I'll give you a cupcake if you do. Imagine also that Joe has faculties similar to yours. The fact that you trust yourself (for the sake of the cupcake) gives you no reason to trust Joe. If the only reason offered for trusting yourself in the first place is the attractive reward to be attained thereby, then the fact that, enticed by this incentive, you trust yourself does not give you reason to trust anyone else, no matter how similar their faculties are to yours. The only way a reason to trust yourself -- whether getting a cupcake, or avoiding psychic dissonance -- should extend to trusting others is if the same reward is offered for doing so.[6]

The final reservation I have concerns Zagzebski's claim that the rationality (so understood) of self-trust commits us to belief on authority, as she claims. If rationality is understood in terms of the kind of psychological harmony attendant upon the resolution of dissonance, and this psychological harmony is cashed out in terms of success "in living a life that survives their own future conscientious self-reflection, a life of harmony within the self" (148; illustrated by her example of the monk, 146-148), it seems possible that a person may be best able to achieve this psychological harmony not by deferring to epistemic authority, but by striving towards an ideal of epistemic self-reliance (9). This possibility seems especially salient when it comes to the way a person forms beliefs in the moral and religious domains. Understanding one's reasons for beliefs about such important matters, and coming to one's beliefs on the basis of one's own understanding, seems to me to be an important part of living well. If what is rational is ultimately justified by facts about what it is for us to live well, in a way that best survives our "conscientious self-reflection" (148), then it seems possible that, at least for some of us, what is rational is to work out our beliefs in important realms (paradigmatically, moral and religious realms), for ourselves, rather than taking beliefs on others' authority.

Epistemic Authority is rich, wide-ranging, and provocative. I strongly recommend it, especially to anyone who is interested in epistemic autonomy, epistemic authority, and the rational defensibility of faith and of believing on the authority of one's epistemic community. It will generously reward a careful and thorough read.

[1] For example: the epistemology of testimony, reasonable disagreement (both at the level of the individual and the community), models of revelation, the distinction between (what Zagzebski calls) first-person and third-person reasons, and the rationality of believing on faith.

[2] Zagzebski calls this reason to believe "prima facie", but clarifies that what she means is that the fact that another person believes p always counts in favor of my believing p, even if on balance I should not believe p. (58n5) I will use the term "pro tanto" to keep this meaning clear.

[3] Zagzebski states initial versions of all four conditions (106-113), and offers variations of these conditions throughout the book.

[4] See Foley, Richard. 1979. "Justified inconsistent beliefs." American Philosophical Quarterly 16(4): 247-257.

[5] For example, our practical interests may play a legitimate role in deciding which investigation to pursue. Or a feeling may legitimately lead us to re-evaluate a belief, as when a persisting feeling of distrust might legitimately lead me to reevaluate my belief that a person is trustworthy.

[6] Likewise if the reason offered is a reason of necessity -- that we cannot help but trust ourselves.