Epistemic Consequentialism

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Kristoffer Ahlstrom-Vij and Jeffrey Dunn (eds.), Epistemic Consequentialism, Oxford University Press, 2018, 335pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198779681.

Reviewed by Brian Talbot, University of Colorado, Boulder


The book is an anthology of previously unpublished papers about whether epistemic norms can be explained in terms of epistemic value, and if so, which epistemic norms, which epistemic values, and how the explanation would work. Overall, I found the book engaging and fruitful. It shows that now is an exciting time to be an epistemologist. The papers contribute to a number of important debates and point towards further needed debates.

Who is the book for? A significant chunk is or engages with "formal" epistemology, and eight chapters out of thirteen have some formalisms in them. But almost all will be of interest to both "traditional" and formal epistemologists, and the majority of the chapters containing formalisms will be accessible to those having at least a superficial familiarity with formal epistemology or decision theory. The writing tends to be accessible, typically ranging from remarkably lucid and easy to follow, even for non-specialists, to readable (although one paper does feel actively hostile to the reader). The book opens with an introduction by the editors which lays out a lot of useful context. The introduction explains what unifies differing theories which are put under the heading "epistemic consequentialism," gives a helpful overview of some of the basic formalisms that are often employed in this literature, and lays out some of the current debates and issues surrounding epistemic consequentialism. For example, the introduction discusses the debate about epistemic tradeoffs, which comes up in seven of the chapters.

Before I go on, I should mention a few ideas that recur throughout both the book and my review. Consequentialist approaches to epistemology explain at least some epistemic norms in terms of epistemic value. To do this, they need an account of epistemic value; typically, this is in terms of true beliefs or accurate credences. They also need an account of how the values explain what we should believe. Often, epistemic consequentialists explain epistemic norms in terms of value promotion: roughly, the norms are such that conformity with them is more likely to cause or lead to more epistemically valuable states of affairs than non-conformity. Sometimes the connection between norms and values is explained employing ideas from decision theory. We might say, for example, that it is irrational to have credal states whose values are dominated, or that it is rational to have the credal state with the highest expected epistemic value. Sometimes epistemic consequentialism seeks to vindicate general epistemic norms like coherence. This involves arguing that they are good norms to comply with or apply to others, by showing how they are properly connected to epistemic value. The problem of epistemic tradeoffs is that in some cases one can form a belief in a way that seems irrational -- believing, for example, against one's evidence -- in order to gain further epistemic value. If we explain what we should believe in terms of epistemic value, then seemingly we should endorse these tradeoffs, but that is counterintuitive.

I'll briefly summarize the chapters. We start with two that are critical of epistemic consequentialism. Clayton Littlejohn argues that standard consequentialist approaches to epistemology will not work: they employ both a flawed value theory and a flawed account of the relationship between epistemic values and epistemic norms. The only plausible epistemic value, he argues, is knowledge, rather than truth or accuracy. Knowledge is attributively valuable: it is epistemically valuable in that beliefs which are knowledge are good instances of the kind belief. Since there is no general normative requirement to promote attributive value, this is a problem for approaches to epistemic consequentialism which explain epistemic norms in terms of value promotion. The next chapter is by Nancy Snow. Starting with psychological research into a real-world sort of tradeoff case -- "adaptive misbeliefs" -- she argues that epistemic tradeoffs are unjustified whether they benefit us pragmatically or epistemically.

We move on to chapters that are more amenable to the consequentialist project. Hilary Kornblith argues that naturalism goes hand in hand with a form of epistemic consequentialism. This is because naturalists want an explanation of our folk epistemic theory, they want this explanation to ground out in non-epistemic terms, and our folk theory sees epistemic norms as goal directed. Together, this means naturalists should want to explain epistemic norms in terms of the pursuit of truth, as consequentialists do. Ralph Wedgwood argues (in some way paralleling Littlejohn) that a value-based approach to epistemology should focus on the value that beliefs instantiate rather than the values they promote (put another way, epistemic norms should be about the values beliefs have themselves, rather than the valuable things they lead to). This is why epistemic tradeoffs are impermissible, he argues, but it still allows for a somewhat consequentialist approach: we can partly explain what is rational to believe in terms of the expected epistemic value of credences, as long as we do not factor in the causal consequences of those credences. Wedgwood does not think, however, that we should explain the norm of coherence in terms of epistemic value. Rather, we should see it as a constraint on how expected epistemic value is calculated.

Julia Driver's chapter stands out for the way it draws parallels between ethics and epistemology. She discusses debates and differences among versions of ethical consequentialism, and how these might connect to or inform issues for epistemic consequentialism. She points out some possible views that have been overlooked by epistemologists, and argues that a form of "sophisticated" consequentialism might solve, or make more palatable, problems that epistemic consequentialism has faced. Among these problems is the problem of tradeoffs: sophisticated consequentialism would endorse the credal states of those who make tradeoffs, but might criticize their epistemic character or reasoning strategies.

The next five chapters are the most formal. Alejandro Pérez Carballo argues that a decision theoretic approach to epistemology can help us to understand what questions are most important to ask, but that we should not see the accuracy of potential answers as the sole measure of the value of questions. Rather, our account of epistemic value should also incorporate the value of explanation. He briefly sketches one approach to measuring the value of explanation and considers some questions this raises. Christopher J. G. Meacham also casts doubts on accuracy as the sole epistemic value. He argues that purely accuracy-based arguments do not vindicate evidence-related epistemic norms like the principal principle or the principle of indifference. He shows that accuracy-based arguments currently used to vindicate these evidentialist norms are not fully compatible with one another, and to some extent assume evidential norms. He also argues that it will not be possible to give new arguments to vindicate norms on the use of evidence purely in terms of accuracy promotion.

Michael Caie and Richard Pettigrew each discuss the decision theoretic principles that we can or should use to explain epistemic norms in terms of epistemic values. Caie claims that causal decision theory won't work, despite being standardly endorsed by those doing epistemic decision theory. His core claim is that causal decision theory cannot assign epistemic values in a huge range of fairly ordinary cases, because of the possibility that the believer's credences about some proposition could affect the truth of that proposition.[1] Pettigrew discusses alternative approaches to epistemic decision theory which have been advanced by Jason Konek and Ben Levinstein (forthcoming) to rule out epistemic tradeoffs. He argues that these cannot work because they would give us epistemic norms that no one should care about, and that we should accept the rationality of epistemic tradeoffs. He goes on to argue that the intuitions against epistemic tradeoffs are in error. Some of the ideas in this last bit of the paper fit well with ideas in Driver's chapter.

James M. Joyce also discusses epistemic tradeoffs. The tradeoff problem, he thinks, arises from a mistake about epistemic value. Accurate credences are not of final value. This is because credences are supposed to guide our actions, and credences are only good inasmuch as they are able to do so. If we make epistemic tradeoffs, he claims, the so-called credences that these give rise to are not credences we would (or should) be willing to use to guide our actions. Thus, the tradeoffs are not really beneficial; we should regard the results as "sham" credences rather than real credences, and so not epistemically valuable.

The final few chapters use epistemic consequentialism to illuminate some interesting issues in epistemology. Sophie Horowitz considers the intuitively plausible idea that we can motivate a form of epistemic permissivism by appeal to epistemic value. The idea is that different agents can respond differently to the same evidence because they value epistemic goods differently. She argues that this cannot be reconciled with epistemic consequentialism. Any acceptable rule for scoring accuracy will require that agents update using conditionalization, so agents with different scoring rules but the same priors will still have to come to the same conclusions. The argument requires that we hold scoring rules to certain standards, such as immodesty. Horowitz thinks we should hold rules to these standards, not because we can vindicate these standards in consequentialist ways, but because these standards just are constraints on rationality. She argues that epistemic consequentialism should be seen as analogous to the consequentialization project in ethics: it is not supposed to vindicate or explain the norms, but rather to formalize the norms we already have.

Amanda Askell also discusses scoring rules. She is interested in whether enkrasia principles -- which say that we should not believe what we think is irrational -- are compatible with epistemic consequentialism. She shows that, as long as agents can rationally have some credences in improper scoring rules (which violate the standards Horowitz endorses), what enkrasia principles rule out and what standard forms of epistemic consequentialism require can conflict.

Finally, Jeffrey Dunn shows that we can construct examples in epistemology that are instances of free riding. In fact, such examples seem to occur regularly in the real world (and even within philosophy itself). This is because empirical research shows that groups form better conclusions when their members hold fast to their initial opinions and debate before making up their individual and collective minds. But he shows that each individual in the group does better, in terms of the total long-term epistemic value of their own doxastic states, by lowering their confidence in their initial view before the debate starts. Because of this, we can get conflicts between what is epistemically good for all of us and what is good for each of us.

There are a number of themes that arise out of the papers. One is that epistemologists may benefit a great deal from studying some ethics. This is explicit in Driver's chapter: many of the distinctions and debates from ethical consequentialism she discusses will, I suspect, be helpful for those looking for alternatives to the forms of epistemic consequentialism currently advocated. The theme is explicit again in Horowitz's suggestion that epistemic consequentialism should be seen as a formalization of a non-consequentialist theory, just as many think deontological ethical theories can be "consequentialized." We see it tacitly in other chapters. Just to pick one example, Askell discusses what uncertainty about epistemic value might mean for epistemic rationality. This is clearly a very important question. A parallel debate is ongoing in ethics at the moment, and I suspect that the different sides of this ethical debate have illuminating things to say about the epistemic issue.[2] Going forward, I'd be excited to see more engagement by ethicists with issues in epistemology, and vice versa.

A related theme is that there is significant disagreement about foundational aspects of epistemic consequentialism, even among those sympathetic to the consequentialist project. This is related to the theme of learning from ethics because ethicists have spent a great deal of time thinking about similar foundational issues, and we may benefit greatly from not trying to reinvent the wheel. Among the disagreements illustrated in the book are disagreements about epistemic value, and what makes that value valuable (compare the views of Joyce, Kornblith, Littlejohn, Meacham, Pérez Carballo, and Pettigrew). Another is disagreement about how to use that value to derive epistemic norms (compare Caie, Driver, Joyce, Meacham, and Pettigrew). Finally, there is a great deal of disagreement about the motivations and aims of epistemic consequentialism. Some of the papers look to epistemic consequentialism to vindicate epistemic norms -- to explain why these norms are the right norms, or are worth complying with (this is how I interpret Askell, Driver, Dunn, Kornblith, and Pettigrew). Others deny this, taking some of the norms or standards to be foundational and not in need of vindication (e.g. Horowitz, Wedgwood, Littlejohn). If we do try to vindicate epistemic norms, we have to be open to surprising conclusions: as with consequentialism in ethics, the norms we end up vindicating might not be the norms that are initially plausible to us. And, in fact, both Pettigrew's and Driver's papers argue that, if we want norms that can be vindicated, we have to revise at least some of our intuitive views. This approach, and the debates about it in this book, show the promise and importance of projects like epistemic consequentialism. In the space I have remaining, I will say a bit about why that is.

Whether or not we accept the value-oriented approach embodied in epistemic consequentialism, we should want to vindicate epistemic norms in some way. Their need for vindication arises from two facts.

First, we have epistemic choices. Least controversially, we have choices about how to direct our attention or engage in inquiry. These choices will indirectly affect our beliefs. To some extent, we can indirectly but intentionally bring about beliefs or credences which fit or do not fit our evidence, or that are more or less coherent. More controversially, we have some degree of direct control over our doxastic states. For example, when our evidence is not decisively in favor of either x or y, it sometimes seems that we can choose to believe either (Ginet 2001, Steup 2017). For another example, sometimes evidence strongly in favor of x will not make x feel true, or will not feel compelling; in some of these cases we can choose to believe x or not (Ryan 2003, Weatherson 2008). Cases like this seem common in philosophy, where evidence often is ambiguous, or is but does not seem overwhelming. So, we have some say over whether our beliefs conform to putative epistemic norms. We can knowingly, even intentionally, have contra-normative beliefs; that's why there is a debate about the rationality of epistemic akrasia (no one would worry about it if epistemic akrasia were impossible). In light of this, we should want to know how to exert our say over what we believe.

Second, no standard epistemic norm -- not coherence, not fit-to-evidence, not conditionalization -- is fully compelling on its face. It is widely acknowledged in epistemology that some truths are worthless (or next to worthless -- being only infinitesimally valuable). I think there are good reasons to think that the vast majority of truths are worthless (we see this when we apply tests for worthless truths that I discuss in Talbot forthcoming). It's hard to see why it matters whether beliefs about worthless truths violate epistemic norms (for a nice recent discussion, see Friedman forthcoming). On standard accounts of epistemic norms, the norms don't discriminate between beliefs about worthless and worthwhile truths, nor do they apply any less, or with any less force, to beliefs about worthless truths. This should make us worry about standardly accepted epistemic norms. Why should we see them as actually normative when it comes to beliefs about worthless truths? If we accept that they don't apply to worthless beliefs, we also get surprising results about credal states containing a mixture of worthwhile truths and potentially worthless ones (see Talbot forthcoming, and Levinstein forthcoming). Even worse, given that the norms do not discriminate between belief about worthless and worthwhile truths, why should we see them as norms at all, even when applied to beliefs about worthwhile truths? These questions are familiar from normative domains like ethics. When a putative ethical norm seems to everyone not to matter at all in some case, this gives us reasons to reject it as a norm at least for that case, and to start thinking about how to amend any alleged general principle from which the failed norm arises.

Since we have some choices about whether to conform to or aim for conformity with any alleged epistemic norms, and there are good reasons to be dubious of standardly accepted epistemic norms, we should be looking to vindicate norms, and not build them into our theories. Once we start looking for this vindication, we have to be open to revising the norms, and may in fact be excited about these revisions. This is what we see in the chapters by Driver, Dunn, and Pettigrew. When we think about vindication, we have to ask questions about what the values are that ground this vindication (if values do at all), and how to derive vindications from these values, which brings us to other debates in this book. These debates are crucial to the future of epistemology, and they are to me one of the most exciting things about epistemic consequentialism, and about this book.


Carr, J. R. (2017). Epistemic utility theory and the aim of belief. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 95(3), 511-534.

Friedman, J. (forthcoming). Junk Beliefs and Interest‐Driven Epistemology. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research.

Ginet, C. (2001). Deciding to believe. In M. Steup (ed) Knowledge, Truth, and Duty, Oxford University Press, 63-76.

Konek, J., & Levinstein, B. A. (forthcoming). The foundations of epistemic decision theory. Mind.

Levinstein, B.A. (forthcoming). An objection of varying importance to epistemic utility theory. Philosophical Studies.

Ryan, S. (2003). Doxastic compatibilism and the ethics of belief. Philosophical Studies, 114(1), 47-79.

Steup, M. (2017) Believing intentionally. Synthese, 194(8), 2673-2694.

Talbot, B. (forthcoming). Repugnant Accuracy. Noûs.

Weatherson, B. (2008). Deontology and Descartes's demon. The Journal of Philosophy, 105(9), 540-569.

[1] Pettigrew mentions in his chapter a principle which I suspect might solve the problem Caie raises (this is the irrelevance of impossible utilities, which Pettigrew attributes to Jennifer Carr, 2017).

[2] I also suspect that the "sophisticated" form of epistemic consequentialism that Driver discusses has something to say about enkrasia: enkrasia principles are not standards for evaluating the rightness of belief, but may be standards for evaluating epistemic virtues or reasoning strategies.