Epistemic Contextualism: A Defense

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Peter Baumann, Epistemic Contextualism: A Defense, Oxford University Press, 2017, 265pp., $74.00, ISBN 9780198754312.

Reviewed by Jonathan Ichikawa, University of British Columbia


Epistemic contextualism has grown up.

Twentieth-century innovations in semantics (David Kaplan on indexicals) and epistemology (G.C. Stein on relevant alternatives) set the stage for the central contextualist idea, which Stewart Cohen, Keith DeRose, and David Lewis articulated in the 1990s: perhaps the sentences we use to talk about knowledge may express different contents in different conversational contexts. Harry tells Ron what time it is. Parvati, who isn't feeling particularly skeptical, says, "now Ron knows what time it is"; Padma, who isn't quite sure whether Harry should just be taken at his word, says, "Ron still doesn't know what time it is." A contextualist may say that Padma and Parvati both speak truly: Padma's sentence is the denial of something stronger than that which Parvati affirmed.

Early contextualists pointed to the possibility of this kind of variability, constructing analogies with other context-sensitive language, and used it to dispel skeptical paradoxes and bank cases. Mature contextualists go further into language, epistemology, or both. The earlier contextualists explain how contextualism fits into compositional semantics, engage with more sophisticated linguistic data, and exhibit scrupulous care with use and mention. The later, mature contextualists take seriously the challenge pressed by early critics of epistemic contextualism, that as a linguistic thesis, contextualism is of limited relevance to epistemology, which is not a linguistic discipline.

Peter Baumann's new book aspires to this latter dimension of maturity. Contextualism, Baumann thinks, is not merely a way of resolving some puzzling paradoxes or accommodating a disparate pattern of intuitions. On the picture he paints, deep epistemic questions about the nature of reliability and the relationship between luck and epistemology motivate a contextualist framework for "knows". The book is largely, but not wholly, a repackaging of Baumann's previous papers. While most of the book focuses on epistemology, one chapter extends the project to a parallel contextualism about discourse concerning moral responsibility.

Baumann is less interested in the linguistic details, and he is deliberately breezy with the use/mention distinction. Strictly speaking, his characterization of contextualism as a view on which "knowledge is not orderly but disorderly in a certain sense" (1) is inaccurate; as Baumann well knows,[1] contextualism is a view concerning the contents expressed by sentences containing the word "knows" -- not a view about knowledge itself. But Baumann follows David Lewis's presentation of immature contextualism, referencing this notorious passage for what Baumann calls "the legitimate dropping of quotation marks" (1):

I could have said my say fair and square, bending no rules. It would have been tiresome, but it could have been done. The secret would have been to resort to 'semantic ascent'. I could have taken great care to distinguish between (1) the language I use when I talk about knowledge, or whatever, and (2) the second language I use to talk about the semantic and pragmatic workings of the first language. If you want to hear my story told that way, you probably know enough to do the job for yourself. If you can, then my informal presentation has been good enough. (Lewis 1996, 566-7)

In hindsight, Lewis was too complacent about use and mention. It is easier to confuse the word "knows" with the mental state knowledge than Lewis thought, and contrary to his claim, not all of Lewis's paper can be restated more carefully.[2] Contemporary epistemologists follow Lewis's carefree example at their peril.

Here are a few examples illustrating the danger. On page 23, Baumann considers a bank case, which he describes as a context shift, but where the subject's evidence differs between the two versions of the case; a pair supporting contextualism would be one where there is only a change in the speaker's context. Later, in response to Stewart Cohen's suggestion that in contexts where the possibility of a newspaper misprint is salient, one can't count as 'knowing' that which one reads in the paper, Baumann replies that "even very critical readers aware of the chances can learn something from the papers" (114). But what is relevant here is whether speakers are thinking about those chances, not whether the subjects are.

On page 34, Baumann suggests that "the context-sensitivity of 'reliability' correlates with and explains the context-sensitivity of 'knowledge'." But the context-sensitivity of one word cannot explain that of another word. What Baumann means, I think, is that contextualism about 'reliability' and contextualism about 'knows' fit naturally together -- if one adopts both, then one can endorse a metalinguistically general 'reliability' condition for 'knowledge'. Baumann gives this version:

If "S knows that p" is true in C, then "S's belief that p is reliable" is true in C. (33)

Contextualism about 'reliable' is Baumann's solution to the notorious 'generality problem' for reliabilism. For any given belief, there are various ways to describe the method that produced it, some more reliable than others. So epistemologists typically think that reliabilism owes an answer to the generality problem: how do we decide which method is the relevant one for the purpose of justification?

Baumann despairs of any general answer to this question -- indeed, he argues that it is even more vexing, because more multivarious, than is typically appreciated. (He carves out separate roles for methods, subject matters, and reference classes, all of which can vary in ways that matter.) Enter contextualism. According to Baumann, people making 'reliable' or 'knows' attributions have in mind particular ways of thinking about subject matters, methods, and reference classes, and this psychological difference in the attributor makes for a difference in the truth conditions of the ascriptions.

Here is one of Baumann's cases:

Consider Anna who is looking at the sky, spots an airplane and comes to believe truly that it is an Air France plane. Suppose that she has her glasses on and has also taken the extraordinary FarSight eyedrops; visibility and other circumstances are normal. Given all this, Anna had a very good chance at arriving at a true belief about the airline to which the plane belongs. Is her belief reliable? This depends on the method she used. So, what is the method used by Anna? If it consists in looking at the sky under normal conditions with glasses on and after having taken FarSight eyedrops, then the method used is reliable, and so is Anna's belief. However, if the method consists in looking at the sky, then (as we can assume in the example) the chances of arriving at a true belief about the airline by using the method are pretty low, even if we add that circumstances are normal; given this method, Anna's belief is not reliable because the method isn't. Between these two methods might lie another method: looking at the sky with one's glasses on. (46)

On Baumann's contextualist view, sentence (1) is context-sensitive in just this way.

(1) Anna knows that the plane is an Air France plane.

Spoken by someone who is thinking of Anna's method as the method of looking at the sky (without reference to visual aids), (1) will express a falsehood; but if the speaker is thinking of the method as looking at the sky with glasses and supersight eyedrops, (1) will express a truth.

Baumann says that speakers "typically" have in mind (consciously or subconsciously) the relevant disambiguations. But not always -- "if not, then the speaker or thinker fails to make an attribution" (45, fn.24).  I worry that Baumann underestimates the prevalence of such cases. In the Anna case, Baumann assumes that the attributor knows much about Anna's situation -- that she's looking at the sky with glasses and eyedrops. But 'knows' discourse does not require such familiarity. If I have no idea how Anna may or may not be investigating her celestial situation, I certainly won't be thinking of her method as one that does, or does not, invoke glasses. Baumann's version of contextualism seems to imply that one cannot express contentful thoughts about subjects while agnostic about what methods they're using.

My other main concern with Baumann's approach to reliability is that it allows speakers' interests to screen off epistemically relevant considerations in implausible ways. Consider Anna again, supposing this time that our speaker is focused on the general method of looking at the sky, without reference to glasses or eyedrops. On Baumann's view, our speaker's context is one in which (1) is false because Anna's belief counts as no more reliably produced than one produced by looking up in the sky without glasses. In other words, in that context, (2) is true, and so (3) is as well:

(2) Anna's glasses and eyedrops are totally irrelevant as to the reliability of her belief.

(3) Anna's glasses and eyedrops are totally irrelevant as to whether she knows whose plane it is.

Consequently, Baumann's contextualism is skeptic-friendly in a surprising way. It is one thing to say, as most contextualists do, that there are very skeptical contexts where even one's technologically assisted vision isn't enough for perceptual knowledge; it's quite another to suppose that in some contexts, someone's visual belief aided by glasses doesn't count as "known" because without glasses, one's perceptual faculties are insufficiently reliable.

This might be plausible if Anna forms her belief without regard to whether she is wearing glasses. But this is no part of the case Baumann constructs. We may suppose -- this is the natural way to interpret the case -- that, if Anna had no glasses, and so ended up with quite an indistinct impression of the details of the plane, she would have remained agnostic about what company's plane it was. So Anna exhibits sensitivity to her evidential situation. Baumann's view is that there are contexts where this is irrelevant. The speaker gets to decide which method and topics are operative, and if the speaker decides the issue is identifying airlines by looking at the sky generally, it makes no difference whether the subject is relying on a better method.

In Chapter 6, Baumann develops a parallel line about moral responsibility. Baumann's central case involves a driver who is driving quickly on an empty street, but in a neighbourhood where most streets have kids playing on them. Suppose a child ends up injured. This was very unlikely, given that it happened on this particular street, but more likely, given that it happened in this neighbourhood, if we do not conditionalize on the street. Baumann suggests that whether the driver counts as "responsible" is a context-sensitive matter. If a speaker is thinking about the street, then no; if the speaker is thinking about the neighbourhood, then yes. As in the case of Anna's vision, Baumann's approach seems to predict that it is irrelevant whether the driver exhibits sensitivity to the presence or absence of children on the particular street. Suppose the driver usually goes slowly in this neighbourhood, but goes more quickly on this particular street, because it very rarely has children on it. (This is analogous to Anna remaining agnostic about when she's not wearing her glasses, but forming confident beliefs when she is.) Baumann's view has it that, in contexts where the neighbourhood is determined to be the relevant consideration, it makes no difference, for the driver's responsibility, which street the accident occurred on -- a surprising result.

In Chapter 4 Baumann offers a novel treatment of the lottery paradox. His treatment centrally involves this principle:

(EP) If S knows that p, then S's epistemic position with respect to p is not fixed and S can get into better or worse epistemic positions with respect to p. (115)

An epistemic position is 'fixed' when there is no possible way for a subject to improve or worsen their epistemic position. I don't see an argument for EP; Baumann simply states that "one might want to" endorse it (115). Baumann's own view is that EP is true in some contexts, but not others -- it's true in those contexts in which we tend to have skeptical intuitions about lotteries. This, he thinks, vindicates those skeptical intuitions, because "in the case of the lottery, there are no better or worse epistemic positions available to the subject with respect to particular propositions like 'Ticket no. 367 won't win.' There is, e.g., nothing I can do to improve (or spoil) the evidence I have for this proposition" (116)

This is a puzzling suggestion -- it's unclear to me why Baumann thinks one's epistemic position vis-à-vis lottery propositions is fixed. Nor can I see any reason to connect the malleability of one's epistemic position with knowledge in the way EP suggests. I don't see what motivation there could be for supposing that a possible change in evidence is a necessary condition for knowledge, in any context. (I can imagine a case being made that necessarily, no epistemic positions are fixed -- this would vindicate the letter of EP (in all contexts), but render it useless in explaining lottery intuitions.)

Chapter 5 discusses the "knowability problem" for contextualism. Here is Baumann's example. Joe is in a less skeptical context, and Ann is in a more skeptical context. In Joe's context, "Joe knows that Ann has hands" is true; in Ann's context, "Ann knows that Ann has hands" is false. Ann is a contextualist, who 'knows' (even relative to her high standards) that there are other people in other contexts -- she knows, for instance, that Joe is in a lower-standards context. As Baumann spells out the worry, "nothing keeps us from constructing our toy scenario by further assuming that the following is true in Ann's context: 'Ann knows that "Joe knows that Ann has hands" is true in Joe's context.'" (122)

Baumann recognizes that many epistemologists deny that Ann can know by her high standards that Joe knows by low standards that p, without herself knowing by those high standards that p. But he complains that without "independent reasons" to think this, "it begs the question against the whole argument that there is a contradiction for contextualism" (128-9). I myself feel no attraction to this key claim; readers may decide for themselves where the burden of proof lies.

If we follow Baumann and accept this assumption, then contextualists have a problem via closure. If Ann knows by her high standards that Joe knows by his low standards that p, then Ann can invoke the factivity of low-standards knowledge to infer that p. Given the closure of high-standards knowledge, this implies that she'll come to know-by-high-standards that p. But by hypothesis, she doesn't know by her high standards that p.

Baumann's solution is to weaken the closure principle. He rejects:

(UC) If S knows-x that p, and if S knows-x that (If p, then q), then S knows-x that q

opting instead for the much weaker:

(DC) If S knows-x that p, and if S knows-y that (If p, then q), then there is a knowledge relation know-z such that S knows-z that q.[3]

By denying UC, Baumann allows contextualists to hold that Ann knows, by her own high standards, that Joe knows-by-low-standards that p, and also to know, by her high standards, that if Joe knows-by-low-standards that p, then p, while denying that she knows by her high standards that p, so long as they admit that there are some standards according to which she knows that p.

This avoids incoherence, but at a cost. Like other closure-denying strategies, Baumann's will countenance abominable conjunctions. In Ann's high-standards context, for example, Baumann is committed to the truth of:

(4) Ann knows that Joe is in a state (viz., low-standards knowledge) that entails that p, but she doesn't know that p.

Footnote 12 on page 97 recognizes that Baumann's approach may license abominable conjunctions, offering this rhetorical question: "But how abominable are these utterances really and if they are, why (see more on this in Section 7.3)?" The reference is to pages 181-2, which argues that some abominable conjunctions are fine when embedded in natural conversational contexts. There, Baumann offers:

Mo: Hi Jean!
Jean: Hi Mo!
Mo: Who were you just talking to?
Jean: Oh, that's Jeff.
Mo: Ah, that's Jeff!? But are you sure it's not a doppelgänger of Jeff?
Jean: (getting impatient) C'mon, I know that's Jeff!
Mo: But you can't prove he's not a doppelgänger? Can you?
Jean: (annoyed) No, I can't. But don't be silly. I know that's Jeff -- even if I don't know he's not a doppelgänger of his!

Even if one agrees with Baumann's characterization of such dialogues as "quite normal," (180), this establishes only that there are some possible sentences of the abominable form that are natural when given in certain kinds of contexts. This existence claim doesn't help with what I take to be the patent unacceptability, in contexts like Ann's, of the particular abominable conjunction (4).

More generally, I sometimes found Baumann to be an unreliable guide to the extant literature. His citations are numerous, but include some conspicuous gaps. And I noticed a few occasions where views were mischaracterized in important ways. For example, he says, citing John Hawthorne, that "the plausibility of closure principles seems to depend on using simple cases with just one premise; it seems to fade away as soon as we consider cases with more than one premise," (107) but the Hawthorne passage in question argues the opposite.[4] And on page 122, Baumann writes that disquotation and semantic descent must be possible, even for context-sensitive language. Here he offers two citations. One -- Donald Davidson's -- treats context-sensitive language as an exception to the general disquotational schema; the other -- René van Woudenberg's -- explicitly denies that contextualism is consistent with disquotation.[5] This, combined with Baumann's laxity about use and mention, and his penchant for argument by rhetorical question, risks confusing or misleading some readers.

Despite some of my particular reservations, I am glad to see more epistemologists thinking seriously about the relationship between contextualism and traditional epistemic questions. Baumann is focusing on a fascinating and promising set of questions that are crucial to contextualism's continued maturity in the current century.


Davidson, D. (1984) "Truth and Meaning", in Donald Davidson, Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation, Oxford University Press.

Hawthorne, J. (2004) Knowledge and Lotteries, Oxford University Press.

Lewis, D. (1996) "Elusive Knowledge", Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74: 549-67.

van Woudenberg, R. (2005) "Contextualism and the Many Senses of Knowledge", Grazer Philosophische Studien 69: 147-64.

[1] "For the sake of simplicity and when there is no danger of misunderstanding, I will in the following often use the word 'knowledge' when I should, strictly speaking, mention it." (33)

[2] I have in mind particularly Lewis's discussion of dogmatism (564-5).

[3] In his discussion of lotteries (132), Baumann weakens closure further. Here is his considered statement of a closure principle: " (Contextualist Closure) If "S knows that p" is true in X, and if S in Y competently infers q from p, and thereby comes to believe that q, then there is a context Z such that "S knows that q" becomes true in Z (whether for the first time or not) -- but not if "S knows that q" is antecedently (to the inference) false in X and the truth in X of "S knows that p" requires that S presupposes and takes for granted that q." (137)

[4] Baumann cites Hawthorne (2004, 46-50). Hawthorne writes that "MPC [multi-premise closure] appears extremely intuitive: the idea that one can add to what one knows by deduction from what one knows has a powerful grip on us regardless of whether the deduction proceeds from one premise or many" (46), and "For now, let us acknowledge that the intuitive pressures in favor of MPC are quite significant indeed." (50)

[5] Davidson 1984, 33-35; van Woudenberg 2005, 152: "This means that the contextualist in effect denies disquotation for K-sentences. He denies that the sentence "S knows that p" is true only if S knows that p, or only if S is in the knowledge state vis-à-vis p. . . . Had [it been otherwise], disquotation would hold, and 'S knows that p' would be true if and only if S knows that p. But it is not, says the contextualist, and hence disquotation doesn't hold."