Epistemic Injustice: Power and the Ethics of Knowing

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Miranda Fricker, Epistemic Injustice: Power and the Ethics of Knowing, Oxford University Press, 2007, 188pp., $49.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780198237907.

Reviewed by Lorraine Code, York University


In this elegantly crafted book, Miranda Fricker's timely project of "looking at the negative space that is epistemic injustice" (viii) comes to fruition. That this space has indeed counted as "negative" is curious, to say the least: hence, framing the issue thus is provocative, for it piques the reader's interest in understanding why the negativity, and signals the project's larger capacity to disturb a range of settled epistemic and moral assumptions. Compelling among these unsettlings is the challenge they pose to philosophical preoccupations with "getting things right", where getting them wrong then counts merely as a negative modality, with no claim to analysis on its own terms. Equally compelling is the rapprochement Fricker effects between ethics and epistemology, according neither absolute priority even though epistemology affords her point of entry, yet demonstrating their mutual entanglement. Virtue ethics and virtue epistemology, intertwined, form a skein that draws the pieces of the argument together, yet in a significant departure from Aristotelian conceptions, virtue here is not separated out from power but works with it, negotiates with it, in matters of knowing and doing. Nor is virtue conceived in abstraction from the materiality of places, persons, and communities: epistemic practices are the focus of the analysis, both as they engage with the "real world", and in an intriguing, aptly-chosen selection of literary examples. In its situatedness, the book offers a valuable resource to feminist and other post-colonial epistemology and ethics projects, with their commitments to locating inquiry, both ethical and epistemological, in the circumstances and among the people where its successes are achieved, its failures and harms enacted, and to counteracting the oppressions to which epistemic injustices have routinely contributed, well before this innovative conceptual apparatus made it possible to name and engage with them as such.

The book consists of an introduction, seven chapters, and a brief conclusion. Sections of some chapters have been published elsewhere, but the material presented here is largely new, and either way, this is a path-breaking study. The Introduction offers a clear statement of the author's aim: to explore "the idea that there is a distinctively epistemic kind of injustice", of which she distinguishes two species, testimonial injustice and hermeneutical injustice, each of which consists "most fundamentally, in a wrong done to someone specifically in their capacity as a knower" (1). The analysis centers around a conception of social power which Fricker glosses as "a socially situated capacity to control others' actions" (4), and which manifests in patterns of incredulity, misinterpretation, silencing. Within this frame, her particular interest is in "identity power" and the harms it enacts through invoking identity prejudices under whose sway hearers deny or withhold credibility to/from speakers qua members of a certain "social type" (4). That a person's capacity to claim recognition as a conveyer of knowledge, a bona fide informant, is essential to her or his achieving human value in a first-, second- and third-personal sense is the deep thought that grounds the argument and carries it forward. Thus, with testimonial injustice, speakers are, variously, thwarted in their claims to acknowledgment as subjects of knowledge, and thereby harmed in their self-development. With hermeneutical injustice, speakers' knowledge claims fall into lacunae in the available conceptual resources, thus blocking their capacity to interpret, and thence to understand or claim a hearing for their experiences. When such harms go deep, Fricker suggests, people are "prevented from becoming who they are" (5). Even though they may be experienced and performed individually, these are not merely individual harms: testimonial and hermeneutical injustices come from and refer back to a social fabric within which the biases and prejudices that animate and sustain them are tightly entangled, and conceptual lacunae are more and other than places of unknowing, ready to be "filled in" by inserting the appropriate facts. Structurally, members of some social groups are ill-understood, marginalized, reduced to unintelligibility through patterns of testimonial and hermeneutic injustice that often seem to be everyone's and no one's responsibility. For Fricker, contesting such injustices and harms requires "collective social political change" -- and, in her view, contentiously I shall suggest, "the political depends upon the ethical" (8). Such, in barest outline, is the general conception of this fine book.

In the grammar of classical empiricism or orthodox positivism, the language of epistemic injustice would find no place. This is so not only within the confines of a fact/value dichotomy where statements of value, whether ethical or other, are deemed meaningless because they admit neither of verification nor falsification: it is so also for a simpler empiricism grounded in individually achieved observational knowledge. The implications of variability, even relativity, of there being diverse more or less "just" knowledge claims about "the same thing", of this "negative space" as more and other than a space of error or falsity, would preclude its claims to being taken seriously. Hence the very idea of epistemic injustice is innovative to the point of initiating a conceptual shift in epistemology as it has traditionally been practiced. Admittedly, this shift comes about on ground prepared by a cluster of projects: from some versions of naturalized epistemology, social epistemology, virtue epistemology, feminist and other analyses of situated knowledges, through Foucauldian and other investigations of the politics of knowledge, all of which figure, variously, in Fricker's position. But this is a major shift: in Fricker's own terms, it mobilizes conceptual resources with the capacity to generate "indefinitely many new meanings" (104, italics original). In so doing it moves epistemology into places where knowing matters to people's lives, and where formal analyses abstracted from situations and experiences offer minimal guidance for good epistemic conduct.

Chapter 1 illustrates testimonial injustice through compelling readings of gender power at work in Anthony Minghella's screenplay of The Talented Mr. Ripley, and racial power in Harper Lee's novel, To Kill a Mockingbird.[1] The argument returns to these examples throughout the book. In the screenplay, a female character is patronizingly discredited in her claims to know by a man who assumes she will defer to his word because of the gender inflected power relations he unthinkingly inhabits: how could female intuition counter the "facts" he knows? In the Lee novel, racist power is brutally condoned and perpetuated by "those on the jury for whom the idea that the black man is to be epistemically trusted and the white girl distrusted is virtually a psychological impossibility" (25). Showing how each pattern of conduct passes as matter-of-course within an established social order, the analysis invokes a Foucauldian "metaphysically light" (10) conception of power which, in its agential modality, refers to a social agent or group exercising power over or in relation to another agent or group, in ways that control the other(s)' actions. In its structural modality it is dispersed through the social order where it operates impersonally, almost imperceptibly, yet surely. Again, these modalities are mutually constitutive: whether agentially or structurally, power works "to create or preserve a given social order", to enable or silence, to confer upon certain speakers or groups, qua persons of that kind, "a credibility excess" or "a credibility deficit", thereby enhancing or restricting their epistemic access to the uptake -- the recognition as viable participants in epistemic exchanges -- on which their social self-conceptions depend. In short, they are wronged in their capacity as knowers (21), and especially so by what Fricker calls "tracker prejudices" which are systematic in their capacity to "track" a person of that social type or kind across an entire repertoire of activities, of which economic, educational, professional, sexual, legal, political, religious practices provide a representative sampling (27).

In chapter 2 the analysis expands to focus on stereotypes as themselves stereotypical vehicles of prejudice, in what Fricker calls "the credibility economy" (30 ff). Rather than viewing them as epistemically-morally-politically pernicious forms of hasty generalization by contrast, say, with Gadamerian pre-judgements or putatively more benign practices of categorization, Fricker argues plausibly for a "neutral" sense of stereotype which catches their frequent reliability as part of a "hearer's rational resources" in making credibility judgements. Yet she acknowledges a widespread human susceptibility to relying on negatively, harmfully prejudiced stereotypes, and shows how difficult it is unequivocally to attribute culpability to their users, given that stereotypes and images "can operate beneath the radar of our ordinary doxastic self-scrutiny, sometimes even despite beliefs to the contrary" (40). The analysis of multiple, often subtle, but sometimes cruder operations of prejudice, deftly exemplified in literary and "real life" instances, is one of the most impressive sections of the book. Within this rich store of examples, ever more intricate readings of Tom Robinson, the wrongfully accused black man in Harper Lee's novel, are particularly effective in exposing the effects of stereotypes in excluding members of certain social "kinds" from relations of trust, contributing to their degradation qua knowers, "undermining them in their very humanity" (44). Worth noting, too, is Fricker's reading of Simone de Beauvoir's "epistemic humiliation" in a well-known argument with Jean-Paul Sartre: an act of injustice whose effect was to change Beauvoir's "intellectual trajectory in one fell blow"(51). In white patriarchal societies such epistemic humiliations, often manifested in blank incredulity, are commonplace reactions to women's and other Others' academic, personal, or professional aspirations. They carry the power to destroy a would-be knower's confidence for engaging in the trustful conversations (52-3) of which epistemic communities at their best are made. They can "inhibit the very formation of self" (55), Fricker rightly suggests.

Stereotypes and the practices they engender are no one's and everyone's within a social imagination where members of a society readily grant them "cognitive sanctuary", to borrow Fricker's apt phrase (38, n.9). Yet although a collective social imagination can be "an ethical and epistemic liability" it is also, in her view, a "mighty resource for social change" (38). It is at once the place where creative, subversive challenges to stereotypes and other prejudices claim a hearing and gather transformative momentum -- many of the social movements of the 1960s generated just such challenges -- and a place that can harbour and sustain a certain inertia, a collective complacency in the status quo, a stubborn insistence on the rightness -- often despite ourselves -- of stereotype-confirming injustices. Clearly, it is as components of a socially-saturating belief structure that such injustices as Fricker exposes must be understood: an analysis of individually-owned biases curable by simple empirical counter-evidence could not account for their intransigence and elasticity. Here, though, Fricker's reservations about its residual psychoanalytic baggage notwithstanding, I would enlist the "social imaginary" from Cornelius Castoriadis and Michèle Le Dœuff to explain the systemic-structural operations of belief systems, biases, metaphorics, and imagery. It carries greater explanatory and revisionary force than the social imagination: is more thoroughly systemic in a quasi-Foucauldian sense, more explicitly power-infused and politically oriented, less constrained by residues of individualism than the social imagination. Thus, too, where Fricker holds ethics and politics apart, I see them as co-constitutive in ways that the "social imaginary" better captures. This is more than a mere terminological difference: on this, if on very little else, I would part company with her.

So far I have concentrated on the first third of the book, which prepares the ground for moving epistemic agency away from dislocated, abstract analyses to situate it naturalistically, socially, and hermeneutically within a virtue epistemological frame where testimony occupies a pivotal place, and matters of variable credibility are centrally at issue. Questions of doxastic responsibility and how best to exercise it; of how responsible hearers should develop and practice testimonial sensibility to enable them to be "critically open to the word of others", shape the neo-Aristotelian conception of the virtuous subject, "'trained' or socially educated … to see the world in moral colour … [on] an analogy with … a virtuous agent's ethical sensibility" (71). While ethical knowledge remains uncodifiable, on this account it can, with appropriate sensitivity-training, be sufficiently sure to foster wise judgement, yet sufficiently open to accommodate and evaluate surprises. The question of who (singular or plural) determines the colour scheme of this world remains an open one; but there are guidelines at least in the direction of a basic, if tacit, "do no harm" principle, and more actively in the positive role the account accords to the development of a virtuous epistemic "second nature" (85) for which there is a precedent in Aristotelian moral philosophy.

Yet collective identity prejudice can complicate the development of virtuous testimonial sensibilities and of credibility judgements untainted by unjust, socially sedimented emotional responses. It can also undermine a person in her own conviction that she counts as a possessor or conveyer of knowledge: can exploit a ready-made set of gender prejudices to construct a woman (as in The Talented Mr. Ripley) as a hysterical female and prompt others to collude in the assessment. Analogous failures to correct for responses "saturated with racist constructions of the 'Negro'" (90) permeate the testimonial injustices in To Kill a Mockingbird, demonstrating -- as Fricker convincingly shows -- that "testimonial responsibility requires a distinctly reflexive social awareness" (91, italics original). Again, there is no algorithm for achieving such reflexivity or for showing whether or how it can unseat stereotypes embedded in the social imagination. Prejudice, as Fricker well knows, is "a powerful visceral force" (98) condoned, perpetuated, and insulated against condemnation in social-cultural situations where there are no obvious reasons, no pay-offs, no rewards for examining it or, a fortiori, for attempting to purge it. Indeed, acknowledging the unjust benefits gender or racial prejudice afford to people as members of the dominant sex or race exacts a price: it entails losses, not just of psychic or doxastic comfort, but of the privileges and self-certainties such prejudices confer. Why would a hearer, whose life and the lives of whose semblables have been constructed around the social meanings they install, consider relinquishing those privileges? Is virtue its own motivation? The questions admit of no easy answers and Fricker supplies none, although she rightly insists that a "'vulgar' relativist" resistance to passing moral judgement on other cultures "is incoherent" (106). The appeal must be to exemplary instances and events in which people have managed to move imaginatively beyond damaging practices and policies, have enlisted a critical mass of like-minded others to initiate the new meanings, the collective political change, the (nascent) just society, that is the moral-political goal of systematically countering epistemic injustice.

Germane to advancing this analysis of wrongs done to a speaker by acts of testimonial injustice is a distinction Edward Craig (1990, 35) draws "between a person's telling me something and my being able to tell something from observations of him": between being treated as an "informant" and as a "source of information", which Fricker mobilizes as crucial to "the politics of epistemic life" (130-1). When people are consulted, heard, accorded credibility as informants, their status as epistemic agents is acknowledged and preserved. When they are treated as sources of information, their conduct and attitudes are read from the surface, from a third-person quasi-touristic point of view (and often through "tracking" biases), by contrast with a second-person mode of address that asks and listens. Not being asked blocks possibilities of epistemic collaboration, contestation, negotiation; it silences the voices of the powerless, objectifies them epistemically, thereby again enacting patterns of dehumanizing testimonial injustice that the preempt the exchanges -- the team-work (in Craig's words) -- on which viable epistemic community depends. It is at once personally and socially damaging. Fricker's meticulous analyses of diverse forms of sexual objectification, of women's silencing in sexual encounters, and of pornography (137-142) vividly illustrate how this distinction operates to deny someone/some group "access to what originally furnishes status as a knower" (145).

Where testimonial injustice typically occurs in exchanges of information, hermeneutical injustice belongs to the domains of understanding and interpretation; where testimonial injustice reduces a testifier to "less than a full epistemic subject" (145), hermeneutical injustice, in drawing on socially embedded interpretations and understandings which are differentially available across relations of power and privilege, excludes certain people from communal interpretive discourses. Thus in societies ordered according to hierarchical structures of power and privilege (i.e. in most known societies), the idea is that unequal power relations

can skew shared hermeneutical resources so that the powerful tend to have appropriate understandings of their experiences ready to draw on … whereas the powerless are more likely to find themselves having some social experiences through a glass darkly … [with] at best ill-fitting meanings to draw on in the effort to render [their experiences] intelligible. (148)

As Fricker notes: "relations of power can constrain women's [and members of other marginalized social groups'] ability to understand their own experience" (147). A woman unable to gain a hearing for damage inflicted by persistent sexual harassment, owing to "a lacuna in the collective hermeneutical resources" (150); a man unable to own his "nascent identity as a homosexual" in 1950s America (163-5) illustrate the point. Thus when "some social groups are unable to dissent from distorted understandings of their social experiences", they are blocked in their efforts to claim recognition for the consequent harms. When, for example, the language of "sexual harassment", "racism", "homophobia", or "sexism" had not achieved common currency in the rhetorical spaces of western societies, an entire range of experiential reports could not claim a hearing or expect communal uptake, in a strong sense of "could". People whose experiences can now be understood and responded to under these descriptions were hermeneutically marginalized (153), systemically and systematically, their testimony routinely dismissed as mere reminders of "how things are for a woman in a man's world/a gay man in a heterosexist world/a black person in a white world", in the absence of conceptual and structural resources for addressing the issues. While it is too soon to assert that "new meanings" and their larger injustice-eradicating effects are now securely in place and reliably operative, these conceptual innovations have opened the way toward reconfigured epistemic and ethical engagement with the practices they name, and created spaces for revisionary social-political intervention.

Clearly, then, hermeneutical and testimonial injustice are interconnected in the harms they perform, particularly in their identity-constructive power. Yet they operate differently in that testimonial injustice is an individual-to-individual harm, reliant though it is on features of social-group identity, whereas hermeneutical injustice, with its roots in the collective hermeneutical resource, invokes different culpability issues, some of which refer to institutional, social policies and practices held in place, and tacitly justified, by what I call an instituted social imaginary. Because no social imaginary is seamless, in the gaps, the interstices, there is room for dissent to enter once a wave of justice-motivated collective refusal and creative renewal is set in motion. Yet while Fricker notes that her account points toward an analysis "placed more squarely in the political frame", maintaining that for understanding epistemic injustice "the political depends upon the ethical" (8), "the ethical is primary" (177), in my reading her analysis in this book is as political as it is ethical, especially in its emphasis on the systemic operations of power within and through entrenched social imaginings. Admittedly, it would be dangerous -- even potentially disastrous -- to contest Fricker's ordering outright, to imply that the ethical might have to yield to political expediency or could justifiably give way to the pressures of vested interest. But the two, I suggest, are even more intricately intertwined, thus the ethical task is even more challenging than her claims for the primacy of the ethical suggest. With this book Miranda Fricker has opened space for the new meanings the "more squarely political" analysis will require. Her readers will look forward to the next phase of this creative, vitally important project.


Edward Craig, Knowledge and the State of Nature. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1990.

[1] Anthony Minghella, The Talented Mr Ripley -- Based on Patricia Highsmith's Novel. London: Methuen, 2000; Harper Lee, To Kill a Mockingbird. London: William Heinemann, 1960.