Epistemic Justification

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Swinburne, Richard, Epistemic Justification, Oxford University Press, 2001, 272pp, $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199243794.

Reviewed by Timothy McGrew, Western Michigan University


Richard Swinburne’s Epistemic Justification is a major work that marks the culmination of a lifetime’s distinguished scholarship in epistemology. If the book were merely to bring together in one place his many articles and reflections on the topic it would be well worth notice; but we are particularly fortunate that this is not just a collection of papers but a substantial new work that clarifies and extends his version of foundationalism.

The first chapter surveys various theories of synchronic justification, and the second articulates Swinburne’s notion of belief and his commitment to a modest principle that it is good to have true beliefs. The third and fourth chapters – in many ways the heart of the book – go into considerable detail regarding the types of probability and the criteria of logical probability. In the fifth chapter, Swinburne investigates the basing relation and the nature of things that may rightly be taken as basic. In the sixth, he offers a relatively brief set of reflections on synchronic justification, and in the seventh, he explores the diachronic dimensions of justification at some length. The eighth chapter surveys the range of ways in which the term “knowledge” is used; he concludes that despite their differences, they largely coincide extensionally, at least if they are not deployed with excessive concern for skeptical arguments. An appendix that might almost have been a chapter defends the atemporal approach to Bayesian reasoning against predictivism, and a set of seventeen shorter notes, most of them a page or two long, address specific points that would have interrupted the flow of the main chapters.

There are a few minor typographical errors and slips; two of the latter deserve brief mention. First, Swinburne accepts Hacking’s thesis from The Emergence of Probability that ancient, medieval and early modern philosophers had no general concept of evidential support in the sense of making probable (6). This has been decisively overturned by James Franklin’s superb work The Science of Conjecture (Johns Hopkins, 2001). Second, at the point where he first introduces axioms for probability (65), Swinburne neglects to insert the qualification that r (his dummy variable for the proposition on which one conditionalizes) must not be a contradiction, with the result that his axioms are inconsistent. (The qualification is noted later.)

Swinburne’s own sympathies are broadly internalist, and he presses the generality problem hard against reliabilism (13-20). In his discussion of synchronic justification he argues that although a belief produced by a highly reliable mechanism will, by Lewis’s Principal Principle, have a high logical probability (ceteris paribus), it is not intrinsically more meritorious for having been thus produced – whereas a belief possessing synchronic objective internalist justification, by which he means a belief that really is rendered logically probable by the evidence a subject has for it, is intrinsically meritorious (158-64). Nevertheless, he advocates a (mostly) tolerant pluralism with respect to alternative conceptions of knowledge on the grounds that they will usually coincide.

The generative epistemic principle in Swinburne’s foundationalism is what he calls the “Principle of Credulity”: “Every proposition that a subject believes or is inclined to believe has (in so far as it is basic) in his noetic structure a probability corresponding to the strength of the belief or semi-belief or inclination to believe” (141); or, put more pithily, “things are probably as they seem to be” (142). The rational person, according to this view, is the one who believes everything until he has reason not to do so.

Swinburne’s redefinition of “rationality” makes short work of skepticism – too short, some will say, as it is not backed up by any compelling argument. Perhaps the most significant feature of Swinburne’s approach to epistemological questions is his relative lack of concern regarding skeptical problems. (It is no accident that “skepticism,” even spelled in the British fashion, does not appear in the index.) To give an account of justification is, by his lights, to give an account that captures ordinary language (or at any rate a great deal of it) in which the term “justification” appears; and epistemological theories that fare poorly by this standard are stillborn (20). In this aspect of his positive program he resembles Chisholm; the book is replete with appeals to the criteria that we do in fact take to be indicative of truth, or to the beliefs that we do in fact consider to constitute instances of knowledge. His brisk common-sense attitude allows him to cover a great deal of ground. But it also makes it difficult to determine the extent to which Swinburne’s preferred criteria of evidence and justification can be used to give a robust defense of realism (global or scientific) in the face of skeptical arguments.

The point can be illustrated by a consideration of Swinburne’s treatment of probability. He begins chapter three with a taxonomy of types of probability: physical probability (or “chance”), which is a measure of the extent to which a particular outcome is determined by its antecedent causes; statistical probability, which measures a proportion of events in a (finite or hypothetical) class, and inductive probability, which measures the extent to which one proposition renders another likely to be true. This third type of probability is for Swinburne the most important and most interesting type. He maintains that every proposition has an inductive probability conditional on every other proposition, but that the inductive probability will typically be inexact: P(q|r) may be simply high, or low, or more than half, or less than P(s|t), or equal to P(q) – which he equates with the probability of q conditional on a tautology (62). If we imagine the inductive probability of an illatively omniscient being with correct criteria, we shall have logical probability, which has a value determined wholly by the content of the respective propositions and is determinable . priori (64-5). Of course we are not such deductive paragons, and as a concession to our weakness Swinburne introduces another species of inductive probability, epistemic probability, which reflects our assessment of probabilities under conditions where we may fail to recognize certain entailments among the propositions involved. But logical probability is the ideal toward which, however fallibly, we strive.

This last distinction, between logical and epistemic probability, sounds benign, but it has some unexpected consequences. Swinburne maintains, for example, that astronomers who believed the Ptolemaic (geostatic, epicyclic) system were only justified in a weak sense, since the Ptolemaic system was on their evidence epistemically but not logically probable. “The very fact,” he writes, “that there is a rival theory that does (we now all see) provide a simpler explanation of the observed data available to the Greeks – a logical fact – entails that their evidence did not make Ptolemy’s theory logically probable” (73).

The scope of this remark is quite breathtaking, for it appears to entail fairly sweeping skepticism regarding the logical probability of just about everything. It might be thought that we could rescue the ancient astronomers from the charge of irrationality by reference to background beliefs regarding, say, the Aristotelian theory of motion that Ptolemy and his audience share (Almagest I, 7). But if we are ruthless regarding the assessment in terms of “the possible scientific theories in some area,” (64), then these considerations cannot be invoked to raise the logical probability of the geostatic system; for they too will fall prey to the criticism that there exists (unbeknownst to the hapless Greek and Roman scientists) a better system of dynamics that explains the facts of our experience. Apparently a Copernican (Keplerian? Newtonian?) astronomy could have been evolved wholly from one’s armchair.

Swinburne cheerfully accepts this consequence; I am inclined to say instead that it casts doubt on his conception of logical probability. (I am reminded of that remarkable passage where Schelling, beginning with the bare A=A, “deduces” the electrical and magnetic properties of matter – see his System of Transcendental Idealism in his collected Werke I, 3, 444-50.) It is one thing to define logical probability in terms of the actual deductive and (correct) inductive relations between our evidence and our well-articulated theories; it is quite another to import the notion of omniscience regarding the contents of the catchall. One can, of course, define logical probability in Swinburne’s fashion as comprising both. But then the logical probability of any scientific theory designed to cover the data of ordinary experience is likely to be near 1 or 0, even though (due to our inferential limitations) our epistemic probabilities are nowhere near these extreme values. And this will apply not just to antique positional astronomy but also to our latest and most sophisticated scientific theories.

Where do the criteria of logical probability come from? Swinburne thinks that the job of the philosopher here is to “codify the criteria that we almost all (including scientists) use and believe to be correct” (64). He brushes aside the worry that there might not be any criteria that really do the job on the grounds of its “evident implausibility,” and in the next chapter he asserts with Johnsonian confidence that “quite obviously” many of our judgments regarding the relative probabilities of two scientific theories “are correct” (102). Eventually he settles on four broad criteria: likelihood vis à vis the data, fit with our background information, narrowness of scope (a criterion of little weight if the others are satisfied well (82)), and simplicity.

Swinburne attaches immense importance to this last criterion. He explicates simplicity as a multi-faceted theoretical virtue involving paucity of entities postulated (87), paucity of entity-types postulated (87), relative nearness of predicates to observation (“green” is closer than “isospin” (88-9)), paucity of laws postulated (Kepler fares better here than Ptolemy, who needs separate laws for all of those epicycles (89-90) – it is not clear whether there is a slide here from counting laws to counting free parameters), and leanness of mathematical formulation. This last aspect is cashed out in hierarchies of mathematical terms (the fewer the simpler) and of mathematical entities, operations and relations: multiplication is less simple than addition, vector products are less simple than scalar products, and numbers come in increasing degrees of complexity from integers to rationals to reals. In all of these cases we must compare the simplest formulations of rival hypotheses: matching up the simplest version of X with a deliberately complexified verbal variant of Y is not cricket.

This would be heady stuff if we could justify our instinctive preferences for these various types of simplicity. But this is not part of Swinburne’s project. We start with such criteria, if only tacitly, and philosophy may elicit and clarify them but need not and cannot provide them with any firmer grounding. Even granting these criteria, it is not clear how we are to proceed in actual evaluation of rival hypotheses, as different criteria may pull us in different directions. Was Kepler’s hypothesis of elliptical orbits simpler than Copernicus’s system, also heliostatic but done with circles and therefore festooned with epicycles like its Ptolemaic predecessor? Kepler’s system comes out simpler on a count of laws (or if you please, parameters), but the equations for elliptical motion are themselves more complex than those for circular motion. Swinburne is inclined to say that Kepler’s theory overall is simpler – not just better, but simpler – than Copernicus’s theory, but he concedes that this was not obvious in the seventeenth century (92).

Nowhere does he offer an argument that there is often or ever a fact of the matter regarding relative simplicity when different criteria pull us in different directions. He suggests that there is “plenty of consensus over a range of cases about how to weigh greater simplicity in one respect against less in another” (92). But if we are concerned about a case where the tradeoffs put the relative merits of two theories in doubt, we can always resolve the dispute by finding some fresh data that have high probability on the one theory and low probability on the other – a Bayesian’s version of a crucial experiment (92-3).

Swinburne offers several intuition pumps to bolster his claims about simplicity, and the temptation to tinker with them is almost irresistible. Consider his example (83) of an observed correlation between two variables x and y:

x 0 1 2 3 4 5 6
y 0 2 4 6 8 10 12

It does seem natural to postulate y=2x as the relation, though a more complex expression like

y = 2x + x(x-1)(x-2)(x-3)(x-4)(x-5)(x-6)z

would equally yield the data points collected. We can try picking up more data (e.g. checking the value of y for x=7), and this will eliminate at least one of these two hypotheses along with an infinite number of others. It will also leave infinitely many that are compatible with all of the data so far. No matter, says Swinburne; of the remaining (infinitely many) hypotheses, we will pick the simplest (84).

But it is not clear that there will be a simplest remaining hypothesis. If we find that where x=7, y=1.78, where is the argument that there is a maximally simple function for the full set of our data? And what is the role of error in this process? If we came up with y=13.8, might we not be inclined, prereflectively and without benefit of regression analysis, to write off the difference between this and 14 as a glitch in the measurement? When Boyle does this with the data from which he inferred the gas law that bears his name, we hail his intuition and vindicate him with modern statistical techniques. When Galileo baffles Baliani and Mersenne with errors of up to 100% in his reported experiments with free fall, we share their frustration. Somewhere between these two cases we feel that there must be a reasonable cutoff. But Swinburne does not tell us what it is.

The advertising copy on the back of this book declares that it will “refresh epistemology and rewrite its agenda.” The sheer wealth of provocative ideas and engaging examples goes far toward making good the first part of this claim. But for those who find skeptical challenges to be the heart of epistemology, Swinburne leaves the deepest issues largely untouched. The exploration and vindication of some of his intuitions in more fundamental terms may well advance a traditional anti-skeptical project. But that work will fall to others.