Epistemic Modality

Placeholder book cover

Andy Egan and Brian Weatherson (eds.), Epistemic Modality, Oxford University Press, 2011, 320pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199591589.

Reviewed by Janice Dowell, University of Nebraska-Lincoln


The papers in Epistemic Modality together center around two questions:

1.     How should we represent the most philosophically useful notion of epistemic possibility?

2.     What is the best semantics for epistemic modal expressions in English? Do declarative sentences containing them have truth conditions? If so, what are those conditions and what is required for them to be met? If not, how should we understand the contribution the use of such sentences makes to a conversation?

Epistemic Modality is a must read for anyone interested in either of these questions or related issues. Each of the papers represents an important contribution to the recent literature on one of these topics. The contributions by David Chalmers and Frank Jackson each address the first question, while the papers by Kent Bach, Kai von Fintel and Anthony Gillies, John MacFarlane, Jonathan Schaffer, Eric Swanson, Stephen Yablo, and Seth Yalcin each address the second. Robert Stalnaker's paper doesn't directly address, but is related to issues concerning the first. Space constraints prevent me from doing justice to any of these works. Instead, I will focus this review on a theme shared by almost all of the papers addressing the second question. Aside from Schaffer's paper, each of the papers in this group argues that Angelika Kratzer's canonical contextualist semantics for epistemic modal expressions is in need of revision. If correct, this would be an important development. These authors disagree about what view should replace Kratzer's account and the concerns with the canon raised by some of the authors are unique. But there's also a good deal of overlapping agreement about what the main challenges to the canon are. Showing that the canon is in need of revision promises to be the single greatest contribution of the volume as a whole. I'll focus, then, on assessing these challenges. Towards the end of this review, I'll briefly discuss the positive semantic proposals of Schaffer and Bach and discuss the papers addressing the first question. (NB: Numbers in parentheses refer to page numbers in the paperback edition.)

As von Fintel and Gillies note (108), the canonical semantics for epistemic modals is contextualist. On that view, modal expressions are quantifiers over possibilities whose domains are restricted as a function of context. In the case of epistemic modals, the information available to a group relevant at the context of utterance determines their domains. It's worth remembering a central reason this is the canonical view. In giving a unified semantics for all our modal expressions, it offers a simple, power explanation of a wide range of language use. Accepting any of the revisionary proposals will mean giving up, to greater and lesser extents, on the unity of the modals. Greater departures from the canon, such as expressivism and relativism, absent a demonstration that contextualism about other modals must be given up, too, will be forced to hold that learning modal expressions in English is much more complicated than linguists had previous reason to think.

This theoretical cost puts great weight on the challenges to contextualism. Only if there is no plausible contextualist account that can meet them is there reason to accept any of these revisionary proposals. If there is an empirically adequate contextualist view, its unity will give it an important theoretical advantage over any rival. One way of assessing the conclusions of these papers as a group, then, is to assess the strength of the shared putative challenges to contextualism.

Together, the authors identify a number of such challenges. I'll focus on seven of them pressed by more than one author.

Imagine that Alex is helping her roommate Billy look for her keys. It's fine for Alex to say,

(C) "You might have left them in the car"

and also fine for Billy to reply,

(N) "No; I still had them when we came into the house".

Which body of information should the contextualist hold is selected as the domain determining one for (C) in order to make sense of Billy's (N)? In such cases, several authors suggest, it isn't plausibly the speaker's, since there is no reason for Billy to take issue with the claim that it's compatible with Alex's information that the keys are in the car (Egan and Weatherson (7-8), MacFarlane (148-9), Yalcin (302-3)). This is the Challenge from Disagreement, a challenge to Solipsistic Contextualism, the view that context always selects the speaker's information (MacFarlane, 148). But suppose that the contextualist holds that it's the group's information, Alex's and Billy's together, which is selected? In that case, several of the authors suggest, Alex's original assertion won't be warranted, since nothing in the case mandates that Alex knows what's compatible with the information they have together. Putting together the felicity of both Alex's original assertion and Billy's reply yields the Challenge from Contextual Instability (von Fintel and Gillies (114-116) and Swanson (261-62). (For similar challenges, see also MacFarlane (151-52) and Yablo (271-72)). It looks like the contextualist needs to hold that the solipsistic reading is the favored one, to account for the felicity of the former, and also that the group reading is favored, to account for the felicity of the latter. But both cannot be favored. So, the canonical view needs to be revised in some way.

Call the above case "KEYS". In his paper, MacFarlane argues that the best way to make sense of cases like KEYS is to hold that epistemic modal sentences are semantically invariant, expressing the same proposition in all contexts of use, but have truth-values that shift with shifting contexts of assessment. What accounts for the difference in truth-value at different contexts of assessment is a difference in the body of information that is relevant for assessing the proposition's truth. On the resulting, relativist view, what Alex says is warranted because it's true at her context of assessment and its true at her context of assessment because the information relevant at that context is the information she has at the time of her utterance (since the former context is identical to the latter). What Billy says, (N), is also warranted because it's his information that's relevant at his context of assessment and, relative to that information, what Alex says in (C) is false.

Von Fintel and Gillies defend a less revisionary, different response to the KEYS data. That data, they suggest, doesn't show that contextualism needs giving up, only its canonical version. The trick is to find a way to make both favored readings available at a context of use. Cloudy contextualism is the view we get by accepting this minimal change to the canon. According to cloudy contextualists, the typical use of a bare, epistemic modal sentence involves underdetermination. Instead of asserting a single, determinate proposition, as on the canonical view, a speaker typically 'puts into play' a 'cloud of propositions'. Those put into play will be all of the 'available' readings of her sentence at her context of use (117-18). It's not clear what makes a reading an 'available' one, on their view, but it's clear that they take at least the solipsistic and the group readings to be among those put into play by Alex with (C) (117). A speaker is warranted in saying what she does just in case she is warranted in asserting at least one in the cloud of propositions she has put into play. And an addressee is warranted in responding as she does, just in case she is warranted in accepting/rejecting the strongest proposition the speaker has put into play that she "reasonably has an opinion about" (121). So, in KEYS, both Alex and Billy are warranted in saying what they do.

Elsewhere I argue that getting clear on the KEYS data shows that not even this minimal change to the canon is required for contextualism to fit with that data. Distinguishing different ways of filling out KEYS shows that there is no single case for which competent speakers uniformly have a strong intuition that both solipsistic and group readings must be available. This is enough to diffuse the challenge.[1]

The above Challenge from Disagreement is related to the Challenge from Third Party Assessments (MacFarlane 146)[2]. In the above case, Alex and Billy are part of a single conversation. But what about third party assessments of what a speaker has said? In these cases, the assessor is not herself party to the conversation in which the assessed utterance occurs. These include the much-discussed eavesdropper cases. Suppose while standing in the coffee line, you overhear Sally say to George,

(B) "Joe might be in Boston".

Suppose also that you saw Joe an hour ago in Berkeley. To some, it seems fine for you to say, sotto voce, to the person standing next to you,

(S) "What Sally said is false; I just saw Joe an hour."[3]

Suppose that Joe's being in Boston is compatible with what Sally and George together know. How can the contextualist make sense of the felicity of (S)? The idea here is that, since you're not part of the conversation in which (B) occurs, it's not plausible for the contextualist to hold that your information is relevant for determining what Sally has said (MacFarlane, 146-47, 151).

One issue here is whether (S) is felicitous by being warranted, as MacFarlane's argument requires. If (S) sounds felicitous because it manifests the speaker's semantic competence with the relevant expressions, the contextualist can explain its felicity as easily as the relativist.[4] Another issue is whether the data in these cases is clearly relativist-friendly. As Yalcin notes, intuitions are split in such cases[5] and this needs explaining (Yalcin, 305). One possible contextualist-friendly explanation is that eavesdropping contexts are defective and their defects make it unclear what the original speaker has said, and so unclear what our eavesdropper has said. This would explain the split in intuitions; different assessors repair the context in different ways, hearing what's said in different ways.[6]

Also related to the Challenge from Disagreement is the Challenge from Agreement. Consider a case from the Egan and Weatherson introduction (8-9).[7] Suppose that Andy has read some publicly available material on Jack the Ripper. From his reading, he doesn't conclude that Prince Albert Victor is the Ripper. But he does correctly conclude that this evidence doesn't rule him out as a suspect. Later, watching a program on the Ripper, he hears the announcer say,

(V) "Prince Albert Victor might have been Jack the Ripper".

It seems that Andy can felicitously respond,

(T) "That's true".

What is the contextually relevant group such that Andy is in a position to affirm what the announcer said? Even if the announcer intends to include in the relevant group anyone watching the program, Andy isn't in a position to affirm that Victor's being the Ripper is compatible with the information had by that group. For all Andy knows, someone watching the program has evidence that decisively rules him out. Of those discussed so far, this challenge appears to be the strongest for the relativist. A relativist may hold that asserting (V) is warranted, given the information the announcer has at his context of assessment, since this is just the context of utterance. At the same time, Andy's agreement with what the announcer has said is warranted, given that it is compatible with the information Andy has at his context of assessment.

What should a contextualist say about agreement cases? One issue here is whether it's clear that Andy's apparent agreement is warranted. As we've seen, it's not difficult for the contextualist to make sense of felicitous, but unwarranted assertions. Is it so obvious that what Andy has said sounds fine not only because he competently uses the expressions he does, but also because what he's said is warranted? Another question is whether it's clear that what Andy says amounts to a standard case of agreement or instead is merely agreement-like, some kind of faux agreement. In the imagined scenario, Andy is responding to the assertion of someone he is not in conversation with, indeed, someone who can't hear him; he's talking to the television. This isn't uncommon, but it would be uncommon for a speaker to take herself to be doing the same thing talking to her television that she would be doing if she were talking to someone who might hear her. To see this, consider two slightly different scenarios; in the first, a man sits courtside yelling "don't shoot!" at a teammate about to make an ill-timed attempt at the basket. In the second, the man isn't a teammate of the shooter, but a fan of the latter's team, watching on television. In the first case, it's plausible that the man's utterance is a directive, in Searle's sense. It's an attempt to get the hearer to do something. In the second case, that's not plausible. So, what is the speaker doing? Well, he's doing something that is fit to serve as a directive, if the shooter could hear him. Since he can't, it must be something else, perhaps an expression of frustration at the player's poor performance.

What's Andy doing in the scenario in which he's talking to his television? He's doing something that is clearly fit to be an expression of agreement with the announcer, were the announcer in a position to hear him. Is it so clear that what he is doing amounts to agreeeing, given that the announcer can't? To my ear, it isn't. But there is one more available, contextualist-friendly explanation for those ears that hear clear agreement: In the scenario, Andy relies on publicly available information, much as, we might assume, the announcer does. In hearing (T) as a genuine expresion of agreement, mightn't we be assuming, and assuming Andy is assuming, that he and the announcer have much the same infomation? If so, then the contextualist has no trouble explaining why we hear what Andy says as expressing agreement with the very proposition the announcer has uttered. To rule out this possibility, we'd need to consider a case in which it's clear that Andy and the announcer have quite different bodies of information. I would be surprised, though, if speakers uniformly heard (T) in such a case as a clear expression of agreement.

Another challenge to contextualism stems from metasemantic considerations. It's apparent from consideration of the full range of cases in the literature that, whatever story the contextualist favors about how it is that modal propositions are determined as a function of context of use, it won't be much like any of the straightforward stories that can be told about paradigmatic indexicals, such as "I" or "now". Egan and Weatherson suggest that this means that the metasemantic story will need to be "hideously complex" (9). Thinking about paradigmatic indexicals, one might think that the metasemantic story for context-sensitive expressions are never "hideously complex". If so, that would cast doubt on the plausibility of any contextualist about of epistemic modals. (Call this the Challenge from Metasemantic Complexity.)

However, as Michael Glanzberg [2007] notes,[8] whatever the proper story is for how demonstratives get their referents determined as a function of context, it's going to be pretty complex. So, there are clearly context-sensitive terms that require complex metasemantic stories. Indeed, one might treat the case of demonstratives as a source of inspiration for the development of a proper metasemantic story for a contextualist account of modals.[9] There's a related objection one might press here instead, though. It might seem that, absent such a story for our modal expressions, any contextualist account of epistemic modals is hopelessly ad hoc.[10] However, that objection is a double-edged sword. Consideration of the full range of cases in the literature also shows that the relativist will require a complex story about how it is that bodies of information are made relevant for the determination of truth-values at contexts of assessment.[11]

Egan and Weatherson suggest a second metasemantic challenge, the Challenge from "Semantic Change in Attitude Ascriptions" (9-11). It begins with an observation about some clearly context-sensitive expressions, such as "we". It seems to be part of the semantics of "we" that the speaker must be included in the group denoted. Similarly, in many cases, the speaker seems to be in the group whose information must be (by the contextualist's lights) content-determining at a context in which an epistemic modal is used. So, they suggest, the contextualist must hold that "by analogy, it is part of the meaning of 'might' that the speaker is always part of the [group relevant at a context of use]". If true, we should then expect that the speaker is always included in the relevant group. The trouble for that view, they note, is that there are other cases that requires the speaker's exclusion, e.g. some cases of attitude attribution. So, the idea goes, contextualism creates an expectation defeated by the data. This, they conclude "look(s) like a good enough argument to motivate alternatives".

Given their acceptance of Glanzberg's observation, however, this argument is a bit surprising. If we model the metasemantic story for modals on the story for demonstratives, rather than a context-sensitive term like "we", we won't expect them to have simple constraints on the range of values they can take at a context. That the speaker must sometimes be excluded to understand certain cases can then be taken to be some reason to think epistemic modals don't function like "we". But there's an independent reason to think they don't. Epistemic modals aren't special kinds of expression, on the canonical contextualist account. They're semantically neutral expressions that take on an epistemic flavor as a function of context. True, some expressions, like "might", seem to require an epistemic flavor. But others, such as "ought" and "must", have both deontic and epistemic flavors. Some deontic uses of "ought" and "must", what I elsewhere call "objective" uses,[12] are clearly not relative to anyone's information; they're relative to the facts. If the contextualist were required to hold that being relative to a body of information that includes the speaker's was part of the meaning of "ought" and "must", we'd have a pretty quick demonstration that contextualism is false. But the contextualist needn't say that and, for these reasons, shouldn't say that.

What the contextualist does need, though, is an explanation for why the speaker is included in some cases and excluded in others. Elsewhere I argue that what the clear cases requiring speaker inclusion share is figuring in rationalizing explanations of a speaker's action. In cases in which an epistemic modal is being used to explain another's action, the speaker may be clearly excluded. It's easy to see how such a proposal will at least track the needed distinction between unembedded uses and those involving third-personal attitude attributions. (For a detailed explanation for why action explanations in particular should generate the observed pattern, see Dowell [2011].)

Yalcin, in his paper here and elsewhere,[13] poses another important challenge to contextualism, the Challenge from Epistemic Contradictions (Yalcin, 300-02, echoed by Yablo, 273). Sentences of the form "φ and ~might φ" "sound awful", he suggests. While initially it might seem that the oddity of those could be given a Moorean, pragmatic explanation, along the lines one could give for "φ, but I don't know it", that explanation is defeated by embedding each under "suppose": "Suppose φ, but I don't know it" sounds fine (as a Moorean explanation would predict), but, "suppose φ and ~might φ" doesn't. The problem, as Yalcin sees it, is that it's not clear how any descriptivist account of epistemic modals talk could make sense of the oddity of such suppositions, since descriptivists hold that unembedded, declarative uses of epistemic modals represent ways things could be (298). If they represent ways things could be, then "φ and ~might φ" should represent a way things could be. But then it should be possible to suppose that things are as "φ and ~might φ" represents them as being. But it isn't. Since contextualism is a form of descriptivism, this presents a problem for contextualism (301).

Is it really so hard to find such suppositions intelligible, though? Consider this case. Imagine a father, after hearing the morning's weather report, asks his young son to carry his raincoat to school with him. "But it's not raining!" his son protests. "No, it's not", his father concedes, "but it might. And whenever it might rain, you should carry your raincoat." Imagine that his son continues to protest.

(W) "But what if it doesn't rain! Then I'll have carried my coat for nothing!"

It is perfectly good, fatherly advice to reply,

(R) "Well, suppose it doesn't rain, but it might. In that case, it's still a good idea to carry your raincoat."

It's not hard to multiply cases of advice and instruction of this kind. If that's right, then "contradictions" doesn't seem an apt label for such constructions. And, more importantly, the descriptivist seems well-poised to explain why such uses sound fine.[14]

Swanson, Yablo, and Yalcin each offer additional challenges to contextualism, as well as thoughtful suggestions for what a rival proposal that meets them might look like. Space prevents me from considering their rich discussions, but they are all excellent, deserving of a careful read. In the space I have remaining, I'll turn to very quick discussions of the positive, semantic proposals of Jonathan Schaffer and Kent Bach, which are interesting to consider together, and then to a brief discussion of the papers addressing the volume's first question.

In his contribution, Schaffer focuses not on addressing the many challenges to contextualism, but to identifying linguistic phenomena that contextualism seems better poised to explain than relativism. These phenomena suggest that at least "might" and "must" used epistemically contain open arguments in the semantics that get filled at a context by a body of evidence (or bound) (201-09). These phenomena suggest that such evidence figures in what's said, as on the contextualist's view, as opposed to part of what makes what's said true, as on the relativist's.

Bach's radical invariantism is the view that "bare epistemic modal sentences are semantically incomplete" (20). This, he suggests, contrasts with both contextualism and relativism. Unlike radical invariantism, each of the latter "commit the Proposition Fallacy: they assume that if a sentence . . . can be used to convey a proposition, the sentence itself must express one" (29). Set aside the issue of whether this assumption is fallacious. It's clear that it's one the relativist accepts, since the relativist is a semantic invariantist. But what about the contextualist? Schaffer is a contextualist. As we've seen, he suggests that bare epistemic modal sentences contain open argument places that must be filled by context or bound with a quantifier. So, on his view, there is no proposition semantics assigns to, e.g., "there might be licorice in the cupboard" (179). This raises a question about what exactly the contrast is between radical invariantism and certain forms of contextualism about bare epistemic modals.

Finally, I turn to an all too brief discussion of the papers on the nature of epistemic possibility. Both Jackson's and Chalmers' papers are concerned in part in how a notion of epistemic possibility might help illuminate the phenomena of a posteriori necessities. One question each paper addresses is: How might we understand the notion of epistemic possibility such that it is able to serve this purpose? For Jackson, the phenomena of sentences that express propositions that are both metaphysically necessary and knowable only a posteriori serve to highlight a difficulty for possible worlds semantics. Given that the propositions such sentences express are necessary, how are we to understand the representational content they may communicate? On one proposal, one Jackson rejects, there are two distinct spaces of possibilities, the metaphysical and the conceptual ones. The space of conceptual possibilities is broader than the space of metaphysical ones; there are metaphysically impossible, conceptual possibilities. On the resulting view, we might represent the information communicated by the acceptance of a sentence like "water is H2O" by the ruling out of metaphysically impossible, conceptual possibilities in which water fails to be H2O. This proposal is a rival to his own favored two-dimensionalist view, on which there aren't two spaces of possibilities, but rather one space, which may be carved in two different ways. The burden of Jackson's compelling argument is to show two ways in which allowing for conceptually possible metaphysical possibilities seems to lead to incoherence.

David Chalmers is more hopeful that a genuinely conceptual or epistemic notion of possibility may be developed that is independent of our metaphysical notion and that serves the purposes we want such a notion to serve. But he also thinks a purely metaphysical strategy shows promise. In his paper, he develops one of each, noting some possible drawbacks for the metaphysical strategy, while holding out greater hope for the epistemic one. Here I'll explain and then raise one question about the metaphysical strategy.

Any definition of epistemic space, he argues, must obey certain principles. Among those is Plentitude. Where s is any possible assertive sentence token, Plentitude is the thesis that

For all sentences ss is epistemically possible iff there exists a scenario w such that w verifies s.

To each scenario, there corresponds exactly one canonical description, d, of that scenario (64), where canonical descriptions are given in an entirely neutral (i.e. non-Twin Earthable) vocabulary, together with centering information (69-71). A scenario, w, verifies s, when d epistemically necessitates s (70). Epistemic necessitation, in turn, is a matter of a priori entailment (67), where the notion of the a priori is unconstrained by any actual cognitive limitation (66).

How does this framework help illuminate the puzzling phenomena of a posteriori metaphysical necessities? Chalmers suggests we accept a notion of "deep epistemic possibility" on which anything that isn't ruled out a priori is deeply epistemically possible (63). So, to illuminate the phenomena of a posteriori necessities, this framework will need to make room for the deep epistemic possibility of the falsity of metaphysical necessities. Here's how he suggests it does so:

When n is a standard a posteriori necessity [such as that water is H2O], it is plausible that while all worlds satisfy [i.e. comes out true at all worlds w considered as standard worlds of evaluation], some centered world [i.e. scenario] verifies ~n . . . In these cases, we have a centered world verifying the relevant deep epistemic possibilities, as Plenitude requires (71).

However, it's not entirely clear, from the description of the framework given, how this could be so. Remember that verification by a scenario w involves the ability of an ideal reasoner to a priori deduce ~n, from w's canonical description d. Let "n" be "water is H2O" and ~n be "water isn't H2O". Remember that d is in entirely neutral vocabulary (of some idealized language), plus centering. The puzzle is: How could any reasoner, no matter how ideal, a priori deduce the truth of any sentence containing a natural kind term from the truth of any sentence d? Since the vocabulary of any d is entirely non-Twin earthable, it doesn't contain sufficient information to determine the truth-value of any sentence containing a natural kind term.

Let me put this another way. Notice first that scenarios are more coarse-grained than worlds (as Chalmers notes in connection with a different possible objection to his framework (73)). To see this, let da be the canonical description of the scenario that corresponds to the actual world plus some stipulated centering C and dt be the canonincal description of the Twin world plus C. If canonical descriptions can only be given in a neutral vocabulary, da=dt. Given that, canonical descriptions can't be informationally rich enough to settle whether water is or isn't H2O. Indeed, it's hard to see how there could be a fact of the matter.

There may well be a similar puzzle for Chalmers' epistemic construction of epistemic space. I leave that for the reader to determine.


Dowell, J.L. Forthcoming. "Contextualist Solutions to Three Puzzles about Practical Conditionals." In Oxford Studies in Metaethics, volume 7, ed. R. Shafer-Landau.

Dowell, J.L. 2011. "A Flexible, Contextualist Account of Epistemic Modals." Philosopher's Imprint 11 (14): 1-25.

Egan, Andy. 2007. "Epistemic Modals, Relativism, and Assertion." Philosophical

Studies 133: 1 -- 22.

Egan, Andy, John Hawthorne, and Brian Weatherson. 2005. "Epistemic Modals in Context." In Contextualism in Philosophy, ed. G. Preyer and G. Peter, 131 -- 69. New York: Oxford University Press.

von Fintel, Kai and Anthony S. Gillies. 2008. "CIA leaks." Philosophical Review 117: 77 -- 98.

Glanzberg, Michael. 2007. "Context, Content, and Relativism." Philosophical Studies 136:1-29.

Knobe, Joshua and Seth Yalcin. 2010. "Fat Tony Might Be Dead." Unpublished.

Yalcin, Seth. 2007. "Epistemic Modals." Mind 116 (464): 983-1026.

[1] For details, see Dowell [2011].

[2] See also Egan [2007].

[3] Here I somewhat modify MacFarlane’s discussion of the case (146) to reflect that the target of the dispute is the proper semantics and pragmatics of modal expressions, not how to understand apparent mental evaluations of them.  For discussion of true eavesdropper cases, see Yalcin (304) and Egan [2007].

[4] For a discussion of why warrant matters in challenges from eavesdropper and semantic instability cases, see Dowell [2011].

[5] Here Yalcin cites the results of a study he did with Joshua Knobe, citing their [2010] paper.

[6] For a detailed development of such a proposal, see Dowell [2011].

[7] See also Egan [2007].

[8] Egan and Weatherson note his noting (9).

[9] I pursue this strategy in Dowell [2011].

[10] See Egan, Hawthorne, and Weatherson [2005] for development of an objection of this kind.

[11] I press this reply more fully in Dowell [2011].  See that paper and also von Fintel and Gillies [2008] for cases that show that a relativist must be flexible about whose information is relevant for determining truth at a context of assessment.  Finally, Dowell [2011] also develops a non-ad hoc, contextualist-friendly metasemantic account of the needed kind.

[12] See, for example, my [forthcoming].

[13] Yalcin (2007).

[14] Thanks to Herman Cappelen for first suggesting an example of this kind.