Epistemic Paternalism: A Defence

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Kristoffer Ahlstrom-Vij, Epistemic Paternalism: A Defence, Palgrave Macmillan, 2013, 194pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230347892.

Reviewed by Michael A Bishop, Florida State University


The question at the heart of this clear, well-argued book is whether we are "sometimes justified in interfering with the inquiry of another for her own epistemic good without consulting her on the issue" (4). Ahlstrom-Vij's defense of epistemic paternalism comes in three stages: (1) He motivates and defines epistemic paternalism (chapters 1 and 2); (2) he rejects various principled objections to epistemic paternalism (chapters 3 and 4); and (3) he offers a positive justification for the permissibility of three epistemically paternalistic practices (chapters 5 and 6). These practices are:

(1)  Rules of Evidence. Juries are not allowed to consider certain kinds of evidence on the grounds that they are unlikely to weigh the evidence properly. So even though the evidence is relevant -- in the sense that, if properly weighed, it would enhance the reliability of the jury's judgment -- the jury is barred from even hearing it.

(2)  Medical Research. In order to prove the effectiveness of medical treatments, government agencies require that researchers conduct randomized experiments.

(3)  Clinical Diagnosis: Clinics and hospitals sometimes require that doctors use computer prediction models to make diagnoses.

Each of these practices is paternalistic in different ways. The first is paternalistic because it constrains reasoners' access to information (29-32); the second because it limits how information is collected (32-33); and the third because it requires that information be combined and evaluated in a particular way (33-35).

According to Ahlstrom-Vij, a practice is epistemically paternalistic if and only if it meets three conditions.

(a)   The interference condition: the practice interferes with a reasoner's ability to conduct inquiry in whatever way she sees fit.

(b)  The non-consultation condition: the reasoner is not consulted on whether she ought to be interfered with.

(c)   The improvement condition: at least one motivation for implementing the practice is that it makes the reasoner epistemically better off.

Ahlstrom-Vij interprets the improvement condition so that one is epistemically better off only if one comes to an epistemically better belief (36, 125-134). This is not essential to the view. Ahlstrom-Vij takes increased reliability to be a dimension along which a reasoner can be made epistemically better off (50-51). So I am epistemically better off if I reason about a problem more reliably than I did before, even if I do not form a belief about that problem. After all, sometimes a good reasoner will withhold belief while her more careless counterparts plunge ahead.

Ahlstrom-Vij next considers the issue of whether epistemically paternalistic practices necessarily violate a reasoner's autonomy or epistemic autonomy. He argues that there is no legitimate conception of autonomy or epistemic autonomy that requires an institution (e.g., a judiciary, a government oversight agency, a hospital) to permit people to reason as they see fit when making a judgment for which that institution is responsible. (The autonomy chapters do not highlight the role of institutions as I have done here. But the examples of epistemic paternalism that run through the book all involve institutional policies that place limits on people's reasoning, where such limits are motivated, at least in part, by the knowledge that they are essential to bringing about some broader non-epistemic good for which that institution is responsible (70-72). Framing the issue this way makes it intuitively obvious that autonomy considerations cannot provide a principled objection to all such policies.)

In the final two chapters, Ahlstrom-Vij argues that an epistemically paternalistic practice is justified if (but not only if) it satisfies two conditions.

A.   The alignment condition: The epistemic and non-epistemic reasons we have for implementing the paternalistic practice are not at odds with each other (117).

B.    The burden-of-proof condition: The evidence indicates that it is highly likely that everyone affected by the paternalistic practice will benefit epistemically from it (122).

These are jointly sufficient conditions, not necessary ones, for justifying an epistemically paternalistic practice. A practice that satisfies them is justified; but practices that don't satisfy them might be justifiable in other ways. Ahlstrom-Vij argues that the three epistemically paternalistic practices described above -- evidence control for juries, randomized experiments in medical testing, and prediction models in clinical diagnosis -- satisfy the alignment and burden-of-proof conditions. If just one of these arguments is successful, it would prove the book's main thesis: Some epistemically paternalistic practices are justified.

Ahlstrom-Vij clearly articulates and addresses the two most serious objections to his case for epistemic paternalism. While his proposed solutions don't work, I think the problems can be made to disappear with modest modifications to Ahlstrom-Vij's views -- modifications that I think are congenial to his overall project.

Objection #1. The doxastic disconnect problem: A person whose epistemic freedom is curtailed by a paternalistic practice does not always form the belief recommended by that practice. Jury members sometimes vote in ways inconsistent with their beliefs because of evidence they were instructed to ignore in forming their verdict. A researcher might believe that a treatment is effective before she begins conducting randomized studies; and her belief might persist even in the face of a negative result. And doctors might take a prediction model's diagnosis to be merely preliminary, and so act as if it were accurate while withholding belief and remaining vigilant about the possibility of a misdiagnosis.

These scenarios are a problem because of the way Ahlstrom-Vij interprets the burden-of-proof condition (the evidence indicates that it is highly likely that everyone affected by the paternalistic practice will benefit epistemically from it). If we have good reason to think that some people won't come to believe the result of a paternalistic policy and if we assume that the only way a reasoner can be epistemically better off is by adopting an epistemically better belief (e.g., a belief produced by a more reliable belief-forming process), then that policy cannot satisfy the burden-of-proof condition.

Ahlstrom-Vij works hard to overcome this problem by proposing various mechanisms by which people might come to believe the judgment produced by the epistemically paternalistic policy (125-134, 163-165). But these heroic efforts cannot defeat the hard fact that people's beliefs just don't always follow externally imposed reasoning rules. Ahlstrom-Vij suggests that this is because of our woeful tendency to be overconfident about our own cognitive powers (125). And that's often right. But sometimes it's not, as in the case of the doctor who withholds belief about a patient until she is convinced the prediction model's diagnosis is correct. This will often be a wise approach since no such model is perfectly reliable.

A better way to overcome the doxastic disconnect problem is to expand the notion of epistemic benefit to include better reasoning, not just better belief. Even if a juror votes not guilty but doesn't believe it, the epistemically paternalistic policy (if effective!) makes her reason more reliably about her verdict than she would have otherwise; even if the researcher believes a drug is effective on the basis of anecdotal evidence, requiring her to conduct randomized studies forces her to reason more reliably about the issue; and even if the doctor does not believe a prediction model's judgment but takes it to be only a preliminary diagnosis, making use of the model helps her to reason more reliably about the patient's condition.

Objection #2. The epistemic outlier problem: Epistemically paternalistic practices will on occasion have negative epistemic consequences for some reasoners. Some jurors would have reasoned very reliably and reached the right verdict with the omitted evidence; some researchers with strong anecdotal evidence would have reasoned very reliably and saved lives had they been able to prescribe an effective medicine before completing a randomized study; and some doctors who have access to more relevant information than is used by a prediction model can be more reliable than that model. As a practical matter, almost any epistemically paternalistic practice that is applied often enough will have negative epistemic consequences for some reasoners.

These scenarios are a problem because of Ahlstrom-Vij's burden-of-proof condition on the justification of epistemically paternalistic practices (the evidence indicates that it is highly likely that everyone affected by the practice will benefit epistemically from it). On a straightforward reading of this condition, the three practices described above do not meet it. We can be practically guaranteed that some highly skillful reasoners will not benefit from the practice.

Ahlstrom-Vij tries three moves to solve the epistemic outlier problem. First, he distinguishes between accidental and non-accidental adverse effects. "Accidental effects are the opposites of reliable effects, and thereby low probability effects" (123). But this is irrelevant. It doesn't matter how small a percentage of reasoners are adversely affected by an epistemically paternalistic practice. As long as the practice is somewhat likely not to benefit at least one person, it cannot be highly likely to benefit everyone. Ahlstrom-Vij's second move is to argue that if we were able to identify specific people who will be adversely affected by the practice, we could reframe the practice so that it no longer applied to them (125). While this point is reasonable enough, it doesn't respond to the objection. When we implement an epistemically paternalistic policy, we usually have no idea who exactly will benefit and who exactly will suffer. As long as it is somewhat likely that someone will not benefit from the practice, the burden-of-proof condition cannot be met.

The epistemic outlier problem arises because Ahlstrom-Vij insists on understanding the issue of epistemic paternalism within a framework of individual rather than social epistemology. This forces him into the awkward position of trying to justify epistemically paternalistic policies in terms of their bringing epistemic benefits to the individuals who carry out those policies. This is clear in Ahlstrom-Vij's third move against the epistemic outlier problem: "we in effect are placing an empirical bet as to what will have the best effect for those interfered with" (124). But this is not how such practices are justified. Certain social institutions are responsible for passing certain judgments. Policy makers justify the judgment-producing practices of their institutions, including paternalistic ones, on the grounds of reliability (among others). This is clear in the rules of evidence example. Members of a jury instructed to ignore some piece of evidence in their deliberations might vote one way but believe another. And this prospect is completely irrelevant to the justificatory status of the practice. (Indeed, in voir dire, prospective jurors are often asked whether they can put their personal beliefs aside in order to follow the court's rules of evidence.)

The epistemic outliers problem disappears once we understand epistemic paternalism within the framework of social epistemology. The fact that some individual or other is likely to be more reliable than an institution's judgment-producing practices does not, by itself, undermine the justificatory status of those practices. Of course, if policy makers were to discover better judgment-producing practices, they might not be justified maintaining the status quo. But the mere fact that someone or other is likely to be more reliable than an institution's current practices does not make those practices unjustified.

By arguing that Ahlstrom-Vij would do better to frame the issue of epistemic paternalism within the context of social epistemology, I don't mean to suggest that epistemically paternalistic practices can never apply primarily to individuals. In fact, they can. But the examples of epistemically paternalistic practices at the center of this book apply primarily to the judgment-producing practices of institutions, not to the belief-forming mechanisms of individuals.

Against my attempt to frame this issue in terms of social epistemology, Ahlstrom-Vij might argue that to get the benefits of an epistemically paternalistic social practice, it is practically necessary to improve the epistemic lot of those individuals whom the practice constrains (70-72). There is a sense in which this is true. For an institution's judgment-producing practices to work, individuals must do their part. This will sometimes make them epistemically better off, by helping them to reason better or by prompting them to form better beliefs. What's more, some institutions are better off epistemically if people do form beliefs. A researcher is more likely to vigorously pursue and defend a hypothesis she genuinely believes. But the relationship between the epistemically best social and individual practices is unlikely to be a simple one (e.g., Kitcher 1990).

As social scientists learn how to shape our environments to make us better reasoners and happier citizens, issues of autonomy and paternalism (epistemic and otherwise) are bound to become more urgent and pressing. With this book, Ahlstrom-Vij has made a clear and compelling case for the permissibility of epistemically paternalistic practices. And despite my worries, I think it is a case that, with slight modifications, wins the day.


Kitcher, Philip. 1990. "The Division of Cognitive Labor." Journal of Philosophy 87, 1: 5-22.