Epistemic Relativism: A Constructive Critique

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Markus Seidel, Epistemic Relativism: A Constructive Critique, Palgrave Macmillan, 2014, 284pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137377883.

Reviewed by John K. Davis, California State University, Fullerton


Natural science is one of the last places you would expect to find evidence for epistemic relativism, yet the sociology of scientific knowledge is sometimes cited as an important motivation for the view, and its practitioners sometimes sound like relativists. Given the recent rise of relativism, it is time to look more closely at this.

This book is meant to discuss and evaluate epistemic relativism in general through a close examination of a view in the sociology of scientific knowledge called the "Strong Program" or "Edinburgh Relativism." Thus, Markus Seidel has two projects: to determine whether the claims made by the Strong Program support epistemic relativism (normative and not merely descriptive), and to determine whether epistemic relativism is a sound view. Seidel is probably right about epistemic relativism and science, but I am not sure his conclusions about that extend to epistemic relativism in other contexts. However, that limitation does not undermine his analysis of relativism and the Strong Program, and this book contributes much to that topic. Moreover, he has other objections to epistemic relativism that are not grounded in the Strong Program.

Seidel is an epistemic absolutist who argues for these theses: 1) the Strong Program does imply epistemic relativism; however, 2) the two major arguments for epistemic relativism are unsound, and 3) epistemic absolutism can account for the phenomenon of apparent faultless disagreement. Chapter 1 is an overview of the Strong Program and epistemic relativism. Chapter 2 is an evaluation of what Seidel considers one of the two major arguments for epistemic relativism: the argument from underdetermination. This is the chapter most closely tied to the Strong Program. Chapter 3 is an evaluation of the other major argument: the argument from epistemic norm-circularity. Chapter 4 concerns faultless disagreement.

Despite the comprehensive title, this book is not a comprehensive survey. Seidel does not discuss epistemic relativism about aspects of knowledge other than standards of justification (such as ideals of rationality, epistemic values, or epistemic virtues and vices). He does not survey all arguments concerning epistemic relativism, nor does he discuss alternatives to epistemic relativism such as contextualism. Most important, he does not attempt to discuss motivations for epistemic relativism other than the Strong Program and the phenomenon of apparently faultless disagreement, such as epistemic modals or flexibility in our willingness to attribute knowledge. My comments here are not criticisms, just boundary markers.

The Strong Program was developed by Barry Barnes and David Bloor at the University of Edinburgh in the 1970s and 1980s. They have been enormously influential in the sociology of scientific knowledge, and their publications are often read as endorsements of epistemic relativism. The heart of this view is that the evidence and methods of natural science do not completely determine theory construction and theory choice, or at least not on all occasions, and that psychological, social, and cultural factors (I'll call these "social factors") also play a role in determining our natural science theories. In short, natural science theories are underdetermined by the kinds of factors commonly thought relevant to science, and that leaves room for other factors commonly thought to be irrelevant. Is this a kind of epistemic relativism?

Epistemic relativism is typically defined as the view that there is more than one set of standards of epistemic justification, that there is no way to demonstrate that your set of standards is superior to any other set, and that knowledge claims are justified only relative to such sets. Barnes and Bloor are not clear in print on whether they are committed to these claims, and different scholars have read them differently on that issue. Seidel interprets some of their comments about knowledge as claims that they are epistemic relativists (see sections 1.1 and 2.2), but of course claiming to be a relativist and arguing for it are two different things. The Strong Program is supposed to support epistemic relativism by providing reasons to believe there are multiple sets of epistemic standards in the sciences -- one of the elements in the definition. Seidel says Barnes and Bloor get there by way of a very strong claim about the role of social factors in scientific belief-formation:

(Rel-BB) All knowledge necessarily has a social component (51).

This ties into the argument from underdetermination (the focus of chapter 2). Saying that scientific knowledge necessarily has a social component is a way of saying that there are multiple sets of epistemic standards because the evidence and methods of natural science always underdetermine natural science theory formation.

Seidel then asks whether the Strong Program really does support the multiple sets element of epistemic relativism in this way. He considers two versions of the argument from underdetermination and rejects both of them. The first is an argument from induction. He concludes that the evidence does not inductively support the necessity claim (noting that this argument does not clearly appear in the writings of Barnes and Bloor). This seems plausible; is it really likely that all scientific beliefs, even in the mature regions of hard sciences like chemistry or genetics, have a social component? The second is a deductive argument from the claim (drawn from Quine) that any set of data is consistent with more than one theoretical explanation, therefore evidence alone does not fully determine scientific belief. Seidel rejects the deductive argument on the grounds that mere consistency with evidence is not confirmation of a theory, and that even if a theory entails certain evidence, the presence of that evidence does not thereby confirm the theory. (It is not clear that this undermines the argument from underdetermination, however, for the argument is that the evidence does not fully determine scientific belief, not that the evidence confirms scientific theory.)

I want to note another issue for the Strong Program version of the argument from underdetermination: even if scientific knowledge necessarily has a social component, those social factors may not qualify as epistemic standards. An epistemic standard is something that should and can guide your belief-formation, at least unconsciously. It seems plausible to say that a norm cannot qualify as something that should guide you unless it would guide your belief-formation if you were rational and aware of it. However, the class of social factors is very wide, so it is possible that some factors would be rejected by rational epistemic agents once they become aware of them. (Suppose you find out that you tend to favor beliefs held by male scientists over beliefs held by female scientists.) Therefore, it is possible that not all social factors are epistemic standards. Indeed, maybe none of them are: the kind of social factors that might survive rational scrutiny are standards like, "defer to the majority consensus unless a preponderance of the evidence disfavors that consensus," where the majority is specified differently in different contexts, and it is likely that all epistemic systems contain such a standard. Of course, this is a problem for Strong Program relativists, not Seidel. Seidel is an absolutist.

This is a good place to pause and note something about the implications of this discussion for epistemic relativism generally. Epistemic relativism is often entertained concerning flexibility in our attributions of knowledge, epistemic modals, and perhaps regions of knowledge outside the hard sciences, such as law, ethics, aesthetic matters, and so on. Showing that there is not good evidence of multiple sets of epistemic standards in the natural sciences does not establish that no such sets exist in other areas. Even if epistemic relativism is implausible in natural science, it is still a contender elsewhere.

That said, showing that there is more than one set of epistemic standards in use is not enough to establish epistemic relativism. The relativist must also show that there is no way to demonstrate the superiority of one of them over the others. This brings us to the norm-circularity argument, which Seidel considers in chapter 3. (From this point on, his arguments are not closely tied to features of the Strong Program.) If his objections are correct, then he has gone some distance toward showing that epistemic relativism is implausible in all contexts, and not just in the context of science, so a lot hangs on this.

According to the argument from norm-circularity, in order to justify an epistemic system (where the system includes claims about which beliefs are justified) one must use the system itself, for beliefs can be justified only within an epistemic system. There is more than one such system. Therefore, it is impossible to demonstrate by rational argument that your own epistemic system is superior to all or most others, for rival systems justify themselves equally well (139). Seidel rejects this argument on the grounds that it gives rise to two dilemmas. The dilemmas are independent of each other, and either alone is supposed to refute the argument.

The first dilemma concerns the claim that the norms of an epistemic system can be justified only in a circular way, from within that system. Seidel says there are two possibilities here: either (a) a circular justification provides epistemic justification for the norms of an epistemic system, or (b) it does not. However, if (a) is correct, then we must ask whether (a) is absolutely true or only relatively true. However, (a) is an epistemic principle, so the relativist must hold that it, too, is only relatively true, like all other epistemic principles, which makes epistemic relativism self-refuting. (This could be explored at greater length; there is a large literature on whether relativism is self-refuting.) Moreover, most epistemic systems reject (a), according to Seidel. That means that most of us have reason to reject the argument from norm-circularity (154-161).

That leaves (b), the possibility that epistemic norms cannot be justified in a circular way. That alternative is a problem too, for it leads to skepticism rather than relativism. It supports the view that we lack knowledge at all, not the view that our beliefs are justified relative to various sets of epistemic principles.

We avoid the two horns of the first dilemma, presumably, by concluding that epistemic norms can be justified in a non-circular way. I am not sure how we do this, but Seidel's discussion of the second dilemma for the norm-circularity argument suggests a way. (He may or may not want to take it.) I'll return to this after we look at the second dilemma.

The second dilemma concerns the claim that there are multiple different and inconsistent epistemic systems. The dilemma is this. Two epistemic systems are not fundamentally different unless they contain fundamentally different epistemic norms, and not just different instances of the same norm. However, Seidel argues, we can identify the epistemic norms of others as fundamentally different only if we can first identify those norms as epistemic norms. To identify their epistemic norms as epistemic norms, we have to assume that they have roughly the same criteria for what counts as an epistemic norm.

If they do, then they do not really have a different epistemic system at all. If they do not, then we cannot be sure their norms are epistemic, and again we lack evidence that there are multiple different and incompatible epistemic systems (172-181). Either way, we cannot have evidence that others use fundamentally different sets of epistemic principles. Seidel backs up this argument with examples concerning beliefs among the Azande about oracles and the debate between Galileo and Cardinal Bellarmine about whether the earth revolves around the sun (more examples from science would have helped here).

As I said above, his argument about the second dilemma may also serve as a way to deny that the justification of epistemic norms is circular -- something he needs to deny so he can avoid the first dilemma for norm-justification. The idea is this: if we all have the same epistemic norms, our justification might be non-circular in the limited sense that if there is only one set of epistemic norms, then those norms might be said to be self-evident (much the way universal agreement on simple rules of arithmetic or logic is sometimes cited as evidence that those things are self-evident). I don't know whether Seidel would take this route (along with the baggage about self-evidence), but it's an option his discussion opens up.

In Chapter 4 Seidel shifts to new ground: the phenomenon of apparent reasonable disagreement. He argues that this phenomenon does not support epistemic relativism, for epistemic absolutism can explain it. He draws from Alvin Goldman's "Epistemic Relativism and Reasonable Disagreement" (in Richard Feldman and Ted A. Warfield, eds., Disagreement, Oxford Press, 2010). Following Goldman, Seidel distinguishes between material evidence (evidence regarding p) and norm evidence (evidence regarding the norms you use to justify your belief that p). Reasonable disagreement is possible between people who have the same material evidence but different norm evidence. However, only one of two parties to such a dispute will be correct about her epistemic norms, for one of the systems contains a false epistemic norm. The disagreement is reasonable because both parties are justified in believing that their epistemic norms are correct, even though at least one of them is using norms that do not actually justify their belief about p.

This view is not, according to Seidel, a form of epistemic relativism, for epistemic relativism says two parties can share all the same evidence and still reasonably disagree. This view says they can reasonably disagree only if they share all the same material evidence but not all the same norm-evidence -- having different epistemic norms means they have different evidence.

This is fine so far as it goes; Goldman's view is a defensible position in the epistemology of disagreement. Still, Goldman's distinction seems to do the heavy lifting here, and I wondered why this particular view is superior to alternative accounts of the faultless disagreement phenomenon. Perhaps more could be said to put this view in context and evaluate its rivals.

This is a book for specialists; much of it will be very tough going even for talented, well-prepared upper-division undergraduates. That said, the relationship between the Strong Program and epistemic relativism is an important topic, and deserves the careful and informed discussion Seidel provides. Anyone interested in Strong Program relativism should come here and have a look.