Epistemic Situationism

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Abrol Fairweather and Mark Alfano (eds.), Epistemic Situationism, Oxford University Press, 2017, 258pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199688234.

Reviewed by John M. Doris, Washington University in St. Louis, and Santiago Amaya, Universidad de los Andes


For 50 years or so, virtue ethics has been among the most prominent topics in moral philosophy, and for the past 15 years or so, situationism has been among the most prominent topics in virtue ethics. Situationism is a venerable view in social psychology, maintaining that personal dispositions matter less to behavior and cognition, and situational factors matter more, than one might expect.[1] Some philosophers have transposed situationism into ethics as a "character skepticism," asserting that character traits are too susceptible to the vagaries of circumstance to serve the requirements of virtue ethics, which insists that character traits may be cross situationally consistent, or robust (Alfano, 2013; Doris, 1998, 2002; Harman, 1999, 2009). The psychological evidence, these skeptics insisted, indicates that robust traits of the sort associated with virtue will not be widely instantiated; instead cognition and behavior will vary, often quite sharply, with situational variation -- even "trivial seeming" situational variation.

Although some defenders of virtue ethics have declared the challenge defanged (Annas, 2011, p. 173n8), the debate continues[2] and has now spread to the neighboring field of virtue epistemology. This is unsurprising, given that virtue epistemology is sometimes explicitly cast as deriving from virtue ethics, and often seems to posit the kind of robust traits that have been shown to be empirically problematic. The literature has grown quickly, and we are now most fortunate to have this excellent state of the art anthology, and the first on the topic.

For the most part, the essays do not -- probably wisely -- dispute the empirical observation motivating the challenge to virtue epistemology: cognition (and the acuity of cognition) varies impressively with situational variation. Instead, they consider the implications of this observation, and whether or not it should be thought to undermine virtue epistemology. These contributions can be divided into three groups. There are, first, the skeptical essays of Lauren Olin and Alfano, which develop the situationist challenge to virtue epistemology. Next are the conciliatory pieces of James Montmarquet, Ernest Sosa, Christopher Lepock, John Turri, and J. Adam Carter and Duncan Pritchard, which attempt to defend virtue epistemology while taking the situationist challenge seriously. Lastly, the essays of Berit Brogaard, Kurt Sylvan, Jason Baehr, Heidi Grasswick, and Nicole Smith explore connections between the situationist debate and other discussions and themes in epistemology.

In this review, we have chosen to focus our remarks on some of the essays, rather than summarizing them all. This, of course, reflects where we think we have something to contribute, not our evaluation of the comparative worth of the essays. As is the philosophical habit, where we do comment, some of our remarks will be critical. The reader should not let our choices and remarks obscure the fact that the book as a whole is a very valuable collection, which can be read with benefit by both scholars new to the debate and those working on its cutting edge.

Situationist skepticism about epistemic virtue originates in papers by Alfano (2011) and Olin and Doris (2014), who raised concerns about the empirical adequacy of virtue-based explanations for successful episodes of human cognition. Broadly speaking, the concerns were of two kinds, corresponding to the existing distinction between virtue reliabilism and virtue responsibilism. On the one hand, the skeptics canvassed empirical evidence to the effect that traditional sources of justified belief -- say, perception and memory -- were served by cognitive capacities less reliable than virtue epistemologies would lead one to believe. On the other, they presented evidence casting doubt on the robustness and generality of the value-laden dispositions to which many theorists had appealed in order to account for our intellectual successes -- for instance, conscientiousness and open-mindedness.

Fairweather's Introduction to the volume presents an informative account of the issues, showing its connections with prior debates about the psychological plausibility of virtue-theoretic approaches in ethics. Whereas Alfano challenges some prima facie plausible responses that have appeared since the publication of his paper, Olin's "Is Every Epistemology a Virtue Epistemology?" generalizes her skepticism to the two main traditional approaches in epistemology: foundationalism and coherentism.

Olin argues that empirical worries afflict not only appeals to virtue, but also appeals to basic (vs. non-foundational) beliefs and inferentially-secured coherence within belief systems. To be clear, the situationist epistemologist needn't be a knowledge skeptic; she can allow that humans attain knowledge in the right conditions and circumstances. Instead, what she doubts is that this success should be understood in terms of epistemic virtue. However, according to Olin, the problem is not restricted to a peculiar brand of epistemology that is explicitly agent-centric, as virtue epistemology is. Rather, as she puts it (p. 22): "sufficiently sophisticated variants of coherentism and foundationalism invariably and centrally presuppose the existence of robust psychological dispositions," precisely of the kind that the empirical evidence suggests are not widely instantiated.

If this is right, then situationist skepticism might have a stronger bite than participants in the debate usually recognize. For, if it is true, it would seem that the cognitive successes that theories of knowledge celebrate would be considerably rarer than anyone has imagined: few cognizers, if Olin's argument works, would have the perceptual and inferential abilities required for forming well-justified beliefs. Embracing this last point is not yet to endorse full-on skepticism, but it does come close. At the very least, it suggests that the prospects of developing a philosophical theory of knowledge following any of the major traditional approaches, all of which depend upon agents' having abilities to form justified beliefs, seem uncertain.

In response to situationist skepticism, many virtue epistemologists have favored a conciliatory approach, a trend reflected by the bulk of essays. Rather than contesting the empirical evidence or its relevance, they have taken seriously the threat posed by situationism and have to varying degrees adjusted their virtue-based approaches.

Turri, for example, admits that the evidence presented by the situationist undermines responsibilism, although he claims that reliabilists can save the day by providing a suitable analysis of the cognitive abilities to which they appeal (Turri's approach is somewhat similar to Sosa's, which we discuss momentarily). Carter and Pritchard, on the other hand, respond by describing a modest virtue epistemology built around the thesis of epistemic dependence: namely, the claim that "whether or not an agent's true belief amounts to knowledge can depend on factors beyond their cognitive agency" (p. 177).[3] Obviously, the details matter a lot here. It is one thing to attempt conciliation; it is another to provide a situationist-friendly account of epistemic virtue.

Sosa's (1980) "The Raft and the Pyramid," is the founding text of virtue epistemology, and his contribution to the present volume, "Virtue Theory against Situationism," develops the required analysis with characteristic balance and insight. Sosa (p. 101) begins with ethics, arguing that the situationist challenge requires "correction, not rejection" of virtue theory. He proceeds via an analogy between moral competence and driving competence.[4] Situational perturbations, like bad weather or hectic traffic, may unsettle this driving competence, so it is not as robust as it might be. Yet manifestly, there are many competent drivers, even many quite good drivers, and it would be absurd to be a skeptic about driving competence. Similarly, while moral competence is not as robust as we might wish, and may be derailed by situational factors, just as the situationist alleges, there are certainly folks who possess moral competence, and some folks are quite good.[5] As Sosa (p. 101) puts it,

we have discovered through the years that we possess neither the robustness of practical wisdom nor the robustness of driving competence that we had once optimistically self-attributed. We overreact, however, if we leap from that fact to the belief that driving competence and practical wisdom are just illusions.

Many situationists, we think, would readily accept Sosa's point. It is a further question as to whether this represents a victory for virtue theory. Even if people have inflated assessments of their driving ability (Preston and Harris, 1965; Svenson, 1981), notions like "competent driver" or "safe driver" can still do normative work; say, in helping determine insurance premiums. What happens, however, if the expectations folks have with respect to their moral competence are "corrected" ? Can virtues still do the normative work, like guiding our ethical aspirations, they are called on to do?

In considering the evidence, Pettit (2015, p. 71-72) concedes that the psychological results establish that "virtue is a frail reed, easily blown in the wind," but he thinks virtue is still an appropriate focus of ethical attention. Here, sensibilities may differ in ways that are not easily adjudicated: some might think frail reeds an uninspiring target for ethical aspiration, while others might argue that realistic aspirations are the only kind of aspirations to have.

Is there more to say in the epistemic case? On Sosa's account (p. 106), an epistemic competence is "constituted by a disposition to succeed when the agent is in certain ranges of shape and situation"; the competent agent will succeed when she is in a specified range of conditions (e.g., not drunk) in a specified range of circumstances (e.g., not in non-standard lighting). Here again, Sosa allows that people may be less reliable than had been thought, for reasons that may be surprising, or even astounding, but this unreliability only obtains in some circumstances. As with moral competence, there is no reason to doubt the existence of epistemic competence, so long as we realize that this epistemic competence is not so robust as we might have thought, and may not transfer across all domains.

Once again, the situationist should agree. Epistemic situationism, as we noted above, does not necessarily entail knowledge skepticism. If, on the other hand, epistemic competence is strongly contextualized -- dare we say frail -- we're back to questions about the normative role that this kind of "virtue" can play. For example, can such competence underwrite the intuition, dear to many epistemologists (e.g., Greco, 2003, pp. 111; Riggs, 2002, pp. 93-4; Sosa, 2003, p. 174), that attaining knowledge is not a matter of luck? Can a person claim for herself cognitive successes obtained because she was in circumstances that she never intentionally sought to occupy -- in part because she never knew that her epistemic competence was dependent upon them?

This dispute might threaten to lapse into a merely terminological debate about who is entitled to use the term "virtue." Yet terminological disputes can matter -- as when thinking about whether revision of a theory in response to criticism is capitulation or vindication (Doris, 2015a). In the present instance, the terminological debate might be understood as a question of whether "virtue epistemology" ought to be understood as a continuation of the great virtue tradition dating back to the Greeks, or whether it ought to be understood (more modestly) as a contemporary reliablism. The situationist, we suspect, will recommend changing the name from "virtue epistemology" to "reliablism," to avoid the appearance of attempting to vindicate a tradition while in fact breaking from that tradition. And with that recommendation, some of the old problems faced by reliablism, problems which motivated the turn to epistemic virtues (e. g., Greco, 2010, ch. 9), may reappear.

Whereas the conciliatory essays show the intricacies of the situationist debate, a number of contributions explore its connections with other debates and concerns in epistemology. Brogaard, for instance, compares situationist skepticism with challenges to virtue-theoretic approaches coming from our everyday reliance on external devices to solve epistemic tasks. Sylvan proposes a form of responsibilism in epistemology free of characterological -- and seemingly psychological -- presuppositions. Baehr explores the consequences of the situationist debate for educational theory and practice.

Regardless of the ultimate destiny of virtue epistemology, a deep and interesting question is to what extent situational dependency creates problems for pervasive forms of epistemic agency and evaluation. With respect to this, several essays in the anthology seek to offer a more optimistic outlook, one according to which some forms of dependence do not constitute threats to, and may sometimes serve as enablers of, knowledge. Carter and Pritchard's above-mentioned avowal of epistemic dependency is a good example of this, as is Brogaard's insistence that a well-developed virtue epistemology can and should incorporate insights coming from the extended mind hypothesis.

In "Feminist Responsibilism, Situationism, and the Complexities of the Virtue of Trustworthiness", Grasswick develops such an outlook in light of recent developments in feminist epistemology. As she notes, feminist versions of responsibilism differ in important respects from the more classical approaches targeted in the situationist debate. For one thing, in feminist approaches, virtues are not introduced to account for everyday epistemic successes; they are instead primarily viewed as "corrective" devices, "rarely" and "heroically" instantiated, to compensate for encompassing situational distortions with damaging epistemic effects, such as power relations (p. 223). For another, because of their focus on the production of knowledge in particular contexts, feminist responsibilists are not especially interested in committing to a set of global epistemic virtues applicable to all contexts (p. 224).

According to Grasswick, these features make some of the situationist criticisms less pressing for feminist responsibilists, who may embrace the idea that the importance of certain virtues might be a function of context. Correction, after all, is not always necessary or urgent, nor does it take the same shape everywhere. Further, by insisting on the social embeddedness of knowledge, responsibilism of this variety is naturally suited to explain how some of our pervasive practices of inquiry and epistemic evaluation are made possible by context -- for instance, in the form of one's social identity or of the communities with which one shares information.

Many situationists, we think, would welcome the emphasis that the feminist responsibilism here places on the social aspects of our epistemic agency.[6] It's very plausibly argued that epistemic theory has been too much concerned with the successes of idealized, atomistic, epistemic agents, underappreciating the dependency on context of these agents and their successes. Still, it is worth asking whether recognizing the situational embeddedness of cognition in this way assuages the worries raised by situationism. Does it make feminist responsiblism, as Grasswick suggests, more compatible with the situationists' concerns?

It might seem not. In principle, being critically aware of one's own social position or being epistemically trustworthy, to take two of Grasswick's examples of epistemic virtues, seem as frail as any of the traits posited by classical responsibilism. For they too are plausibly affected by the kind of epistemically irrelevant features documented in the situationist literature, even on occasions in which their corrective power might be much needed. As academics who spend more time than we should in committee meetings, many of us know this too well: epistemic trustworthiness in the classroom does not always translate to the meeting room.

Obviously, there are many ways by which responsibilists can address these sorts of concerns: as Grasswick herself notes (p. 226), many feminist responsibilists recognize individual virtues to be insufficient correctives for transforming epistemic practices in the ways they believe are necessary. Still, further elaboration would be welcome. If one wishes to make more palatable knowledge's dependence on situation, as various virtue epistemologists want to do, it will be important to begin distinguishing the different kinds of relevant  dependencies. Your epistemic trustworthiness might be domain-specific and circumscribed to a certain community. But, presumably, whether you manifest it ought not to depend heavily on your mood, or whether someone just recently praised you for some unrelated advice you gave them in the past.

In sum, Epistemic Situationism is a valuable contribution to the epistemology literature. Individually and collectively, the essays represent a resource for anyone interested in virtue epistemology, particularly those concerned with the empirical viability of such approaches. Given the affinities between the two literatures, the collection will also prove very useful to those working on the "virtue ethics-situationism debate" that foreshadowed epistemic situationism, and continues to exercise moral psychologists and ethical theorists today (e.g., Miller, Furr, Knobel, and Fleeson, 2015). More broadly, to the extent that epistemologists are interested in how actual human cognition transpires, and how theories of knowledge might account for it (since the dawn of "naturalized epistemology" in the 1950s, a very considerable extent), this volume ought to be consulted by anyone working in epistemology.


Alfano, M. (2011). Expanding the situationist challenge to responsibilist virtue epistemology. The Philosophical Quarterly, 62(247), 223-249.

Alfano, M. (2013). Character as moral fiction. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Annas, Julia. (2011). Intelligent virtue. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Carter, A. J. (2016) Robust virtue epistemology as anti-luck epistemology: a new solution. Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 97(1), 140-155.

Doris, J. M. (1998). Persons, situations, and virtue ethics. Noûs, 32(4), 504-530.

Doris, J. M. (2002). Lack of character: Personality and moral behavior. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Doris, J. M. (2005). Précis of lack of character. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 71(3), 632-635.

Doris, J. M. (2015a). Doing without (arguing about) desert. Philosophical Studies, 172, 2625-2634

Doris, J. M. (2015b). Talking to our selves: Reflection, ignorance, and agency. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Greco, J. (2003). Knowledge as credit for true belief. In M. DePaul and L. Zagzebski (Eds.), Intellectual Virtue: Perspectives from Ethics and Epistemology (111-134), Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Greco, J. (2010). Achieving Knowledge: A Virtue Theoretic Account of Epistemic Normativity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Harman, G. (1999). Moral philosophy meets social psychology: virtue ethics and the fundamental attribution error. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 99, 315-331.

Harman, G. (2009). Skepticism about character traits. Journal of Ethics 13 (2/3), 235-242.

Miller, C. B., Furr, R. M., Knobel, A., and Fleeson, W. (Eds.). (2015). Character: New Directions from Philosophy, Psychology, and Theology. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Olin, L., and Doris, J. M. (2014). Vicious minds: Virtue epistemology, cognition, and skepticism. Philosophical Studies, 168, 665-92.

Pettit, P. (2015). The Robust Demands of the Good: Ethics with Attachment, Virtue, and Respect. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Pritchard, D. (2012). Anti-luck virtue epistemology. Journal of Philosophy, 109, 247-279.

Preston, C. E., and Harris, S. (1965). Psychology of drivers in traffic accidents. Journal of Applied Psychology, 49(4), 284-288.

Riggs, W. (2002). Reliability and the value of knowledge. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 64, 79-96.

Sosa, E. (1980). The raft and the pyramid: Coherence versus foundations in the theory of knowledge. Midwest studies in philosophy, 5(1), 3-26.

Sosa, E. (2003). The place of truth in epistemology. In M. DePaul and L. Zagzebski (Eds.), Intellectual Virtue: Perspectives from Ethics and Epistemology (155-179), Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Svenson, O. (1981). Are we all less risky and more skillful than our fellow drivers? Acta psychologica, 47(2), 143-148.

[1] Situationism, at least as it figures in philosophical character skepticism, is not the view that individual differences like traits "don't exist" (see Doris 1998, pp. 507-509; 2002, pp. 62-6; 2005, p. 667).

[2] Much of the fairly extensive literature may be found in the "skepticism about character" entry at Phil Papers.

[3] For the contrast between a modest and a robust epistemology, see Pritchard (2012) and Carter (2016), who disagree as to whether modesty is enough for a theory of knowledge.

[4] In this he is aligned with recent deployments of the "skill analogy" in defending virtue ethics against situationist attack (e.g., Annas, 2011).

[5] Sosa (p. 111) rightly notes that competencies are best understood relative to the standards of a community. Insofar as some communities may be morally depraved, it looks as though moral competency may in some instances diverge quite sharply from moral excellence, though we lack the space to consider this important issue here.

[6] For example, see Doris' (2015b) "collaborativism" about rationality and agency.