Epistemic Value

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Adrian Haddock, Alan Millar and Duncan Pritchard (eds.), Epistemic Value, Oxford UP, 2009, 360pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199231188.

Reviewed by Joshue Orozco, Whitworth University



The issues surrounding epistemic value have, until recently, been mostly neglected by epistemologists. Today, epistemic value is in vogue. This is largely due to virtue epistemologists’ who argue that non-virtue analyses of knowledge can’t adequately explain why knowledge is more valuable than a true belief falling short of knowledge. However, there are many other value-laden questions. For example: "If knowledge has a special sort of value, what sort of value is it?"; “Should the value of knowledge be grounded in truth?”; “Is truth the fundamental epistemic value?”; “Are all true beliefs equally valuable?”. Despite the recent attention, a sustained discussion surrounding questions of epistemic value has generally been lacking. Consequently, Haddock, Millar and Prichard’s Epistemic Value provides a needed, and highly recommended, collection of essays. The book is composed of thirteen articles divided into two main sections, along with an appendix containing a book review of Jonathan Kvanvig’s The Value of Knowledge and the Nature of Understanding. I will address each section, along with the articles found within.

Part 1: The Value of Knowledge

The first nine articles discuss the value of knowledge, and generally center around what is known as the Value Problem. The problem is generated by an intuition that knowledge has more epistemic value than mere true belief. Indeed, it seems that knowledge is more valuable than any proper subset of its constituents. However, explaining why knowledge is more valuable than an unknown true belief has proven extremely difficult. For example, many epistemologists view truth as the fundamental epistemic value and claim that other epistemic evaluations — particularly, epistemic justification1 — derive their value from their instrumental connection to truth. However, if justification only has instrumental value for getting at the truth, then it’s difficult to see why a justified true belief is more valuable than an unjustified true belief, since in both cases the goal of truth is achieved. Given that justification is valuable and that a justified belief is better than an unjustified belief, the lesson is that finding another valuable property of knowledge beyond truth is not sufficient to explain its value. The other value cannot be merely instrumentally connected to the value of truth, otherwise it will be ‘swamped’ by truth’s presence.

In “”SpellE">Reliabilism and the Value of Knowledge," Alvin Goldman and Erik Olson argue for two solutions to the Value Problem within a reliabilist framework. First, they argue that knowledge is more valuable than mere true belief in that the probability of having more true beliefs of a similar kind is greater conditional on S’s knowing that p than conditional on S’s merely truly believing that p. Second, they argue that sometimes reliable processes attain independent or autonomous value despite initially only having instrumental value. They draw an analogy with moral evaluations and claim that good motives are valuable because they bring about intrinsically valuable actions but are also thought to be goods in themselves.

Jason Baer, in "Is There a Value Problem?," argues that the Value Problem is not well motivated. Intuitions constrain analyses only if, first, they are formal by not providing “any indication of why or that in virtue of which knowledge is more valuable than a true belief.” Second, an analysis must be general “in the sense that it must cover or be applicable to all instances of knowledge”. Baer argues that the guiding intuition for the Value Problem is neither formal nor general, and therefore fails as a constraint on one’s analysis of knowledge.

Martin Kusch, in “Testimony and the Value of Knowing,” approaches the Value Problem from a “communitarian” perspective and claims that we should understand knowledge via the historical process through which the concept was formed. Kusch argues that the ancestral concept, protoknowledge, was valuable in being intimately tied to the institution of testimony and helping the community identify who is a reliable source of information. Since testimony is an intrinsically valuable institution and central to our existence as information sharing creatures, protoknowledge is valuable not only in being true but also by helping to sustain this indispensably valuable institution.

In “The Value of Understanding,” Jonathan Kvanvig argues that, unlike knowledge, objectual understanding - understanding some object or subject - has a special kind of value exceeding that of true belief. Since understanding — which requires “seeing explanatory connections, being aware of the probabilistic interrelationships, and apprehending the logical implications of the information in question” — can be luckily acquired it does not need to respond to the Gettier Problem, which Kvanvig argues makes the value problem for knowledge intractable. Kvanvig admits that there are some forms of understanding — perhaps some form of ‘explanatory understanding’ like ‘understanding why’ — that require the presence of knowledge; however, objectual understanding does not.

Michael DePaul challenges Kvanvig’s claim that ad hoc and gerrymandered analyses of knowledge cannot explain why knowledge is distinctively valuable. This claim seems to assume that those reflecting on an adequate analysis of some concept should recognize whether or not something that satisfies the analysis is valuable. DePaul rejects this assumption since value judgments typically arise from our “ordinary thinking” of the thing in question, whereas our analyses often “employ concepts that are foreign to the ordinary modes of thought within which evaluations find their home.”

In “The Goods and the Motivation of Believing,” Ward Jones examines the role of doxastic goods in motivating beliefs. Adopting the view that that reasons are necessarily potential motivators for beliefs, Jones argues that many doxastic goods fail as motivators and are merely beneficial — or ‘surreptitious’ — side effects of believing. He concludes that if the value of knowledge is accounted for in terms of credit, as many virtue-theoretic accounts suggest, then knowledge is only a surreptitious good and not a motivator for belief.

In “Practical Reasoning and the Concept of Knowledge,” Matthew Weiner argues that although pragmatic encroachment accounts of knowledge — specifically the thesis: it is unacceptable to use p as a premise in your practical reasoning if and only if you do not know that p — can explain why knowledge is distinctively valuable, they are plagued with problems. He argues that properties of beliefs other than justification or truth may be most important for practical deliberation. Consequently, knowledge is valuable not because of its value in practical deliberation, but because it provides many different features of belief that are individually intrinsically valuable.

Pascal Engel, in “Pragmatic Encroachment and Epistemic Value,” not only challenges pragmatic encroachment on epistemic notions, but also its relevance to the value of knowledge. Engel acknowledges the relevance of practical interests to whether or not we form our beliefs. Although pragmatic considerations often have a significant effect on the extent of our intellectual inquiry, they don’t determine whether we ought to form the beliefs we do.

Wayne Riggs, in “Luck, Knowledge, and Control,” closes the first section of the book by examining the connection between luck and knowledge. Riggs accepts that some kind of luck is incompatible with knowledge, but argues that luck understood in terms of a safety condition — a la Prichard (2005)2 — is incapable of adequately explaining this connection. Rather, Riggs develops a notion of luck that involves agential control and argues that it is better suited to explain the adage that knowledge and luck are incompatible.

Part II: Truth and Epistemic Appraisal

The next four entries in the book focus on the value of truth and its connection to other epistemic evaluations.

Michael Lynch, in “The Values of Truth and the Truth of Values,” examines two meta-normative positions regarding the value of truth. Many claim that “it is prima facie good that, relative to the propositions one might consider, one believe all and only those that are true” or that “it is correct to believe <p> if and only if <p> is true”. Lynch argues that unlike in meta-ethics where skepticism about moral value — as articulated in expressivist theories — may be plausible, skepticism about the epistemic value is untenable and self-undermining.

In “Epistemic ”SpellE">Normativity," Stephen Grimm argues that teleological accounts that claim that beliefs inherit positive value insofar as they promote or achieve truth — which is intrinsically valuable — face a dilemma. An unrestricted approach that claims all truths are intrinsically valuable clashes with intuitions that there are trivial truths with seemingly no intrinsic epistemic value. However, a more restricted approach claiming that truth is valuable insofar as it addresses subjects that are of interest or importance to us fails to account for the appropriateness of epistemic appraisal for beliefs of subjects that seem uninteresting or unimportant.

Michael Brady, in “Curiosity and the Value of Truth,” challenges the claim that truth’s intrinsic value is conditional on it satisfying our inquiries and curiosities. First, it seems possible that our inquiries and curiosities are aimed at things that are of little value. Second, it is unlikely that we have a general, open-ended interest in truth. Brady argues that curiosity is an emotion involving selective attention and functions to alert us to things that are interesting and valuable. However, this does not imply that true beliefs have value if and only if they are answers to intrinsically valuable questions, but rather that the aim on inquiry is intrinsically interesting truth — rather than truth simpliciter.

Finally, in “The Trivial Argument for Epistemic Value Pluralism,” Berit Brogaard argues that epistemic monism — the view that truth is the fundamental epistemic goal — entails the thesis — (FT) - that the truth value of any proposition is relative to the world of evaluation. Unfortunately, (FT) fails adequately to accommodate the linguistic data. This failure brings epistemic monism into question and motivates epistemic value pluralism, the view that truth is only one of many epistemic goals whose supremacy can be overridden.

The book also contains an appendix consisting of a symposium on Jonathan Kvanvig’s The Value of Knowledge and the Pursuit of Understanding. Kvanvig first provides a brief summary of his main thesis: that although knowledge does not posses any special value exceeding the value of its subparts, understanding does. John Greco, Catherine Elgin and Wayne Riggs provide responses to Kvanvig, who then provides replies to the respondents in turn.

Greco provides a few criticisms of Kvanvig’s defense of his main thesis. First, he accuses Kvanvig of vacillating between different criteria for what qualifies as a successful answer to the value problem. Second, he challenges the claim that we have a pre-theoretic intuition that knowledge is more valuable than any of its proper parts. Third, he claims that Kvanvig’s diagnosis fails since virtue theoretic accounts of knowledge can provide an adequate explanation for the value of knowledge even given his overly demanding requirements.

Elgin addresses Kvanvig’s contention that understanding is factive. She claims that scientific progress constitutes increased understanding. However, since scientific theorizing ineliminably involves idealizations, scientific understanding does not entail truth, but rather provides “epistemic access to matters of fact.”

Riggs attempts to clarify the nature of the intuition motivating the value problem and argues that we should not expect that knowledge is more valuable than any of its proper parts but rather that knowledge possesses a kind of value that is not present in any non-knowing state.


I do not have the space to discuss all (or most) of the articles in this book, and so will focus my comments on what I take as a promising approach to the value problem, and then make some related points about the value of truth.

Unlike John Greco, I concede the intuition that knowledge is more valuable than any proper subset of its constituents. But like Greco, and unlike Jonathan Kvanvig, I am optimistic that a virtue theoretic account can provide an adequate explanation of the value of knowledge. On such accounts, knowledge is a true belief manifesting an intellectually virtuous performance. In other words, knowledge is had when an individual is creditable for reaching the truth because of her intellectually virtuous performance. This property of being creditable is supposed to have intrinsic and distinctive epistemic value. Since one can be successful without performing virtuously and since one can perform virtuously without being successful, being creditable carries epistemic value distinct from the value of the success and from the value of the virtuous performance. Moreover, virtue theorists claim that being creditable for a success can have value exceeding the value of a successful virtuous performance because one’s performance can be virtuous and successful without being successful because virtuous. Gettier cases are examples where one’s performance is virtuous and successful but not creditable.

One challenge for virtue accounts is explaining when a person deserves credit, since performing successfully and virtuously is insufficient. Greco has analyzed credit in terms of “the content and pragmatics of causal explanations,”3 in which credit is - in part — dependent on our interests and purposes. In his reply to Greco, Kvanvig criticizes this approach, and I think rightly so. However one need not adopt Greco’s pragmatic approach. Ernest Sosa does not analyze intellectual credit in terms of the pragmatics of causal explanations. In fact, Sosa does not provide a detailed analysis of what intellectual credit requires, but rather gives an intuitive picture of what credit amounts to in performances generally. For example, suppose that a skilled archer’s shot is diverted from the bull’s eye by a gust of wind and then suddenly reoriented back to the bull’s eye by a second gust. It seems that the success of the shot was not because of the skillful performance, but merely fortuitously successful so that the archer is not credited for the success. Admittedly, it may be vague whether an individual is creditable for some successful performances. There seems to be no clear line to draw regarding how much luck precludes credit. However, as Kvanvig, following Aristotle, states in his discussion of understanding, “we should not look for more precision than the subject matter allows” (341). Furthermore, this is consistent with how we make moral evaluations. Despite recent work in moral psychology showing that we are strongly influenced by our surroundings and situations, we take ownership for many moral behaviors. We offer praise and blame, credit people for performing rightly and assign discredit when they perform wrongly, even while recognizing that there were other causally relevant factors in the behaviors. But while a certain amount of luck is consistent with credit, sometimes the external world is too involved so that our behaviors, though appropriate, do not sufficiently explain the consequences.

Still, in order for one’s performance to be creditable it must be virtuous. So what is entailed in a virtuous performance? Some — like Greco and Sosa — argue that a virtuous performance requires the possession of an intellectual virtue, which is understood as a stable disposition to reach the truth. However, one problem with this approach is that even if being successful because of one’s reliable character is sufficient for a kind of credit, there is reason to doubt that this sort of credit entails distinctive intrinsic value. Suppose that two identical twins received extensive physical examinations immediately after birth. James is perfectly healthy. John, however, has an undersized heart, which would normally result in health complications. However, through a stroke of good luck John is blessed with a guardian angel who prevents any heart complications from arising. Although his heart is unreliable in sustaining healthy individuals, John’s health is identical to James’s. According to the reliabilist view for credit, only James is creditable for his good health and therefore his health should be more valuable than John’s health despite being qualitatively identical. However, this seems to the wrong conclusion. What we value is whether or not John’s health is inferior to James’s. If we were given the choice between John’s and James’s physical makeup, knowing they would result in qualitatively identical health, it seems to me that we would — and should — be indifferent to which physiology we ended up with.

Another way of conceiving a virtuous performance focuses not on having a virtuous — i.e., reliable - character but on acting virtuously. This approach allows for the possibility of acting virtuously in a way that is out of character. And one natural way to understand acting virtuously is by appealing to responsible performances. For example, with regard to our intellectual performances specifically, given that the aim of intellectual inquiry is to acquire true beliefs and avoid false beliefs, one might claim that in order to receive credit for reaching the truth one must be intellectually responsible; that is, one must engage in the intellectual practices and employ those cognitive faculties that one has good reason to believe will reliably yield true beliefs. Of course, in order to receive credit one’s intellectual practices must in fact be reliable. Only those who responsibly engage in reliable intellectual practices are potential knowers. But by focusing on responsible - in addition to reliable - performances one now has the resources for solving the value problem. In order for additional value to accrue to one’s performance, one’s aim must be achieved through responsible and reliable behavior, and we do assign distinctive value to responsible performances. If given the choice to be either fortuitously given a reliable physiology or to acquire one as a result of one’s responsible behavior we should prefer the latter.

Issues of doxastic control immediately arise. Many argue that in order to be responsible for our beliefs we have to have some sort of control over them. It also seems, however, that we do not have direct control over what we believe. Perhaps a sort of indirect control is all that’s needed to be responsible for our beliefs. This connects closely with Riggs’s argument that epistemic luck understood in terms of agential control best preserves the widespread judgment that luck undermines knowledge. I have argued that in order adequately to answer the value problem by appealing to credit, a virtuous performance necessitates a responsible and reliable performance. If responsibility entails control then the above argument can be seen as supplemental to Riggs’s discussion. However, it is worth noting that some have made strong arguments that responsibility for our beliefs does not require the sort of control exhibited over our actions.

Lastly I want to make some brief comments about the value of truth. By accounting for the value of knowledge in terms of being credited for a true belief via responsible and reliable performance, I have assumed that truth has intrinsic epistemic value. Grimm, however, challenges this assumption in his contribution by appealing to the existence of trivial truths, i.e., truths that seem to have no epistemic value. For example, believing truly that there are 959 motes of dust on my desk seems devoid of all value.

Grimm rightly notes that Ernest Sosa offers a solution to the trivial truths objection by restricting our evaluative judgments to domains. Once so restricted, we can then appropriately identify fundamental and derivative values within a given domain while acknowledging that such values may lack overall value or value outside that domain. For example one can acknowledge that scoring runs is a fundamental value within the domain of baseball without making any commitments about the overall value of scoring runs. Similarly, in the epistemic domain truth is a fundamental value, although some truths may lack value outside of that domain.

Grimm objects, however, that by indexing the value of truth to the epistemic domain one fails to account for the binding nature of our epistemic obligations. He claims that “to judge a belief to be justified is not simply to judge that it is ”SpellE">skillfully oriented to the truth but rather that it should be so oriented, in some binding sense of ’should’" (257). However, it is not clear what sense of ‘binding’ Grimm is referring to. We are often presented with cases of conflicting value - for example, between the practical and the epistemic, or between the moral and the practical — and it seems a mistake to think that the epistemic will always trump other considerations. A mother who has overwhelming evidence that her son will die of cancer may be all-things-considered permitted — and perhaps obligated — to believe that he will survive if that belief will bring her and her son hope and strength. Now, there is a sense in which the mother still ought not to believe that her son will survive. But this is the more circumscribed, domain-specific notion that Sosa is endorsing. Consider one last example. There are probably many baseball players who shouldn’t be — all things considered — swinging at the pitches they swing at. Rather they should be at home spending more time with their families. However, this fact doesn’t invalidate the way that their performances can still be evaluated from within the domain of good baseball playing. In this more narrow sense they should be swinging at the pitches they swing at. After all they are right down the middle of the plate. Epistemic norms are always binding within the intellectual domain just as hitting norms are always binding within the baseball domain. However, once we stop outside the respective domains all bets are off.

I’ll close by reiterating that discussions surrounding epistemic value are in their infancy, and Epistemic Value provides a needed resource in what is sure to be a burgeoning area of inquiry.

1 By “epistemic justification” I’m referring to that epistemic property that converts a true belief to knowledge. Given that Gettier cases bring into question traditional JTB analyses of knowledge my use of ‘justification’ is intended to include a fourth condition if a fourth is needed.

2 Duncan Pritchard. 2005. Epistemic Luck. Oxford UP.

3 John Greco, “Knowledge as Credit for True Belief,” in Intellectual Virtue: Perspectives from Ethics and Epistemology. Michael DePaul and Linda Zagzebski (eds). Oxford UP. Pp. 111-134.