Epistemology After Sextus Empiricus

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Katja Maria Vogt and Justin Vlasits (eds.), Epistemology After Sextus Empiricus, Oxford University Press, 2020, 335pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190946302.

Reviewed by Diego E. Machuca, Consejo Nacional de Investigaciones Científicas y Técnicas


Pyrrhonian skepticism's influence on, or relevance to, modern and contemporary epistemology cannot, I think, be overstated. Suffice it to consider the problem of conflicting appearances, the problem of the criterion of truth, the problem of the regress of justification, the epistemic significance of disagreement, and the nature and aim of inquiry and its connection with suspension of judgment. Regarding all these topics, the extant writings of Sextus Empiricus -- our chief source for ancient Pyrrhonism -- have exerted a crucial direct or indirect impact, even though this is not always duly recognized. The twofold purpose of the volume under review is to explore "epistemology after Sextus, both ways in which he has influenced the history of philosophy and ways in which he and the Pyrrhonian tradition he represents ought to contribute to contemporary debates" (1). Regarding the second part of this purpose, the editors remark that they "aim to (re)instate Sextus as an important philosopher in these discussions in much the same way that Aristotle has been brought into discussions in contemporary ethics, action theory, and metaphysics" (1), and that "while the relevance of Sextan skepticism has been observed at points in modern philosophy, it has yet to be appreciated more fully among contemporary philosophers who are not specialists in ancient philosophy" (10). Likewise, we read on the back cover that the volume aims "to put Sextus back in the center of epistemology." It should be noted, though, that particularly over the past fifteen years a number of important studies by both specialists and non-specialists in ancient philosophy have examined the significance of Pyrrhonism in the context of contemporary philosophy, especially in epistemology but also in other areas such as ethics and political philosophy. Unfortunately, and surprisingly, the great majority of these studies are not cited or discussed in the volume.

Of the sixteen contributors, six are women, which is most welcome inasmuch as it ensures some degree of diversity. However, it is regrettable that there is in this volume a complete absence of contributors from, e.g., Latin American countries or such European countries as France and Italy, despite the fact that a considerable number of scholars from these countries, capable of writing in idiomatic English, have a long record of publications in the areas covered in the volume, namely, the history of skepticism and contemporary epistemology. Moreover, ten contributors hold positions or live in the United States, two in both the United States and the United Kingdom, one in Canada, one in Germany, and two in Sweden. The same lack of diversity is observed in the seventeen-page bibliography at the end of the volume, which contains only fifteen publications in a modern language other than English: one in French (from 1887) and the rest in German. Of the publications listed in German, three are actually used in English translation and two thirds of the rest were published more than a century ago -- the most recent publication being a monograph by Katja Maria Vogt published in 1998. To really ensure diversity in academia, one should pay attention not only to gender, but also to race, nationality, and language.[1]

The volume is divided into four parts: "Appearances and Perception," "The Structure of Justification and Proof," "Belief and Ignorance," and "Ethics and Action." As will become clear below, these titles do not always reflect the topics addressed in the chapters within each part, and some of the chapters seem to be arbitrarily grouped together. The essays are, on the whole, erudite and readable, and some of the contributors are renowned specialists. I will briefly summarize each essay and, when appropriate, make a few critical remarks mostly in connection with the volume's twofold aim. Before doing so, let me say something about a couple of claims made in the "Introduction." Vogt and Justin Vlasits rightly observe that "Pyrrhonian skepticism is defined by a commitment to inquiry" and that "being a skeptic . . . is to engage in ongoing inquiry of a certain sort" (1). However, they also claim that "Pyrrhonism is self-consciously open-ended, foreseeing epicycles of objections and replies, arguments and counterarguments in perpetuity" (1) and that the Pyrrhonian argumentative "strategies can be repeated and refined, allowing the skeptic to continue inquiring into a given topic indefinitely" (5; italics added). To the extent that the Pyrrhonist does not rule out the possibility that their ongoing inquiries might come to an end by discovering the truth about the matters under investigation, it is misleading to describe those inquiries as continuing in perpetuity or indefinitely. The editors also maintain that "Pyrrhonian inquiry, like all ancient philosophical traditions, has a deeply ethical orientation," given that "[a]ccording to Sextus, the skeptic's life of inquiry is the best and correct way to live" (8). To the best of my knowledge, nowhere does Sextus make such a claim. But if he did, he would be a sitting duck for his rivals: they would swiftly accuse him of blatant inconsistency inasmuch as he would be making the very same kind of claim about how things really are that is the target of his skeptical assault.

John Morrison opens the first part with "Perceptual Variation and Relativism." He defends perceptual relativism, according to which, at least in certain cases, two conflicting perceptions can be true, against the objection that it cannot explain the phenomena of color inaccuracy and color constancy. In Morrison's view, perceptual relativism cannot account for these two phenomena only when it is combined with what he calls "perceptual atomism," according to which "color perception is relative to a perceiver and a kind of perception" (17). He therefore proposes to combine perceptual relativism with what he dubs "perceptual structuralism," according to which "color perception is relative to a 'structure' built out of comparisons to other objects" (17). At one point, Morrison refers to the Democritean response to the conflict of perceptions, which consists in denying that any one of the conflicting perceptions is accurate, and points out that Sextus does not accept this response because it is at variance "with his skeptical view that we can't know anything about external objects, not even whether they are or are not colored (Outlines 1.15)" (13). The second-order claim -- which Morrison later ascribes again to Sextus by referring the reader to PH 1.99 and 219 (14, 16; see also 17) -- that we cannot know anything about external things could only be accepted as a correct description of the Pyrrhonian stance if and only if it could be interpreted in the sense that, at least thus far, the skeptic has been unable to determine which conflicting perception, if any, corresponds to how the object really is. But at first glance the second-order claim in question corresponds to the kind of non-Pyrrhonian position that Sextus attributes to certain members of the so-called skeptical Academy as well as to the Cyrenaics and medical Empiricists, namely, the view that things are inapprehensible or unknowable. This view is clearly incompatible with the skeptic's ongoing open-minded inquiry. Let me finally note that in none of the passages referred to by Morrison (PH 1.15, 99, 219) does Sextus say anything about the impossibility of knowing external objects. Rather, Sextus remarks that the skeptic suspends judgment, or refrains from making assertions, about external objects. Of course, first-order agnosticism could be based on the above second-order claim, but Sextan Pyrrhonism is also a second-order agnosticism: the skeptic suspends judgment about whether it is possible to know how things really are.

In "Illusory Looks," Kathrin Glüer engages in the debate between relationalists and intentionalists in today's philosophy of perception, which she thinks is echoed in the ancient debate between Pyrrhonists and their Stoic and Epicurean opponents. She defends a version of intentionalism she calls "phenomenal intentionalism," according to which "(visual) experiences both are beliefs (of a peculiar kind) and have contents . . . that usually are true" (49). Such experiences do not "ascribe properties such as redness or roundness to material objects," but rather "'phenomenal properties' such as looking red or looking round" (61). Glüer claims that this view can account for non-veridical experiences, such as illusions and hallucinations. At the outset of the chapter, she contends that "skeptics reject the [Epicurean] claim that all perceptions are true" (48). Actually, skeptics do not accept such a claim inasmuch as they suspend judgment about it, which in no way amounts to rejecting it. Setting aside a handful of passages that are the object of scholarly controversy, whenever Sextus gives the impression of trying to establish that a given position is to be rejected, his aim is actually to show that there are arguments against the targeted position that appear to be as strong as the arguments in its favor.

In "Bayesian Liberalism," Megan Feeney and Susanna Schellenberg argue that liberalism, i.e., the view that "a subject can have immediate perceptual justification to believe propositions about her environment simply in virtue of having a perceptual experience of the environment" (75), is compatible with Bayesianism. The connection with Pyrrhonism, briefly explained in two paragraphs, concerns the distinction between perceptual evidence (expressed with the proposition "This is red") and introspective evidence (expressed with "It seems to me that that is red"). They contest what they regard as the Pyrrhonian assumption that "the acquisition of perceptual evidence is primarily a matter of forming introspective beliefs about seemings or appearances" (78). Whereas the formation of such beliefs "is an extra step over and above the acquisition of perceptual evidence" that "requires the possession of seeming or appearance concepts," Feeney and Schellenberg think that one can acquire perceptual evidence even if one lacks such concepts or is incapable of forming the relevant introspective beliefs (78). I am not sure that the Pyrrhonist takes perceptual evidence to be a matter of forming introspective beliefs about his appearances, but there is indeed some textual evidence that Sextus takes the Pyrrhonist to have beliefs and knowledge about the way he is appeared to -- though there is also evidence in Galen that some Pyrrhonists deny to have knowledge of how they are affected.

The next chapter, "Variation and Change in Appearances," by M. G. F. Martin makes no mention of Sextan Pyrrhonism, and hence no attempt to explore its possible relevance to the topic it tackles. Martin takes issue with G. E. Moore's view that the reason why one can say without inconsistency both that a boat at a distance looks large to one and that it looks small to one is that there are multiple senses of 'looks'. Martin argues instead that there is ambiguity in 'looks'-statements rather than in the verb itself, and that the lack of inconsistency is due to the fact that we use different standards of comparison. When we say that the boat looks large to one, "we invoke one kind of comparison between an aspect of the boat and other things," whereas when we say that it looks small to one not in order to contradict the previous statement but to "fill an account of what it is like to look at the boat across the ocean, we invoke a different standard of comparison between an aspect of the boat and looks that small things can have" (113).

In the final chapter of the first part, "The Force of Assumptions and Self-Attributions," Peter Pagin examines whether assumptions and the Pyrrhonist's ascriptions of appearance properties to himself have assertoric force. In his view, while the former do not have assertoric force, the latter do inasmuch as "Ascribing to oneself an experience without any external existence presupposition is just as assertoric as ascribing to oneself an experience with" (123). I would have expected a deeper discussion of what kind of speech act is at issue in the Pyrrhonist's reports on his own appearances, a subject that has received considerable attention among specialists. Unfortunately, Pagin bases his interpretation of Sextus exclusively on a passage of Vogt's entry on ancient skepticism in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy. Here, as in other chapters, more editorial intervention would have made it possible to encourage a deeper engagement with Sextus's Pyrrhonism or to avoid certain inaccuracies in the analysis of his stance.

Marko Malink opens the second part with his essay "Hypothetical Syllogisms and Infinite Regress," which explores the use of what we know as the Pyrrhonian modes of infinite regress and hypothesis in an argument by the Neoplatonist Ammonius in his commentary on Aristotle's De interpretatione. The argument in question seeks to establish the priority of categorical over hypothetical syllogisms. Aristotle and Theophrastus discuss arguments appealing to infinite regress and hypothesis, and scholars consider it probable that the Pyrrhonian modes of infinite regress, hypothesis, and reciprocity (what epistemologists today know as "Agrippa's Trilemma") were inspired by the first book of Aristotle's Posterior Analytics. Although Malink constantly mentions the "Five Modes of Agrippa" (which include also disagreement and relativity), it is nothing but a label used to refer to a group of arguments, since he nowhere takes into consideration the way in which Pyrrhonists availed themselves of them. Malink's analysis is based exclusively on the discussion of arguments appealing to infinite regress and hypothesis in the Peripatetic school. Given the purpose of the volume, one would have expected an examination of whether Ammonius was influenced by the Pyrrhonian use of the two modes in question.

In "Sextan Skepticism and the Rise and Fall of German Idealism," Jessica N. Berry takes issue with "the received view" of the relationship between skepticism and German Idealism, which portrays the major figures in this movement "as champions of rational optimism and innovative defenders of the autonomy and authority of reason against the corrosive effects, both practical and philosophical, of skeptical doubt" (154). By focusing attention on Gottlob Ernst Schulze's Aenesidemus (1792), Berry argues that the Pyrrhonism reanimated in that short treatise raised a powerful, and ultimately unanswered, challenge to the arguments and assumptions of the German Idealists.

Duncan Pritchard closes the second part with "Wittgensteinian Epistemology, Epistemic Vertigo, and Pyrrhonian Skepticism." He argues that in On Certainty Wittgenstein offers "a distinctive account of the structure of rational evaluation" according to which "all rational evaluation by its nature takes place against a (normally) tacit set of fundamental commitments [namely, hinge commitments] that are themselves essentially rationally groundless, and hence not in the market for knowledge" (173). In Pritchard's view, such an account resolves one version of Cartesian radical skepticism and exhibits significant philosophical overlaps with Pyrrhonism. Setting aside his claim that "the Pyrrhonian thought that the application of the skeptical modes led to a life of flourishing, a good life" (182; see my objection above to a similar claim made by the editors), Pritchard's view on the connection between Wittgensteinian hinge epistemology and Pyrrhonism is viable only if -- as he himself recognizes -- one accepts the interpretation of Sextan skepticism as targeting theoretical beliefs while leaving untouched everyday beliefs. But even if one accepts this interpretation, there remains a crucial difference between the two stances. For if one takes seriously Sextus's remark that the Pyrrhonist remains engaged in an open-minded inquiry into the truth about the matters about which he at present suspends judgment (PH 1.1-3, 2.11), then he does not think we should abandon theoretical philosophizing for good because it is the source of philosophical problems that are nothing but illusions. Nor does he intend, by means of the modes of suspension, to make "people aware of the ultimately groundless nature of their beliefs" (182). For all the Pyrrhonist knows, the dogmatic (in the ancient sense of this term) style of philosophizing might after all turn out to be correct. And for all he knows, his beliefs might turn out to be rationally grounded -- we should not forget that the Pyrrhonist makes a dialectical use of the modes. Of course, if he made such discoveries, he would cease to be a Pyrrhonist, but we should bear in mind that he does not discard the possibility that he might at some point become a dogmatist by discovering the truth -- if any such truth there is -- about the matters under investigation.

The third part of the volume consists of four essays, the first of which is Kathryn Tabb's "'The Skeptical Physitian': Locke, Pyrrhonism, and the Case against Innate Ideas." There was in antiquity a close philosophical connection between Pyrrhonism and medical Empiricism, to the point that several Pyrrhonists, among which Sextus Empiricus himself, belonged to the Empirical school of medicine. Tabb makes a strong case for the view that Locke's theory of psychopathology and his psychologized epistemology were heavily influenced by medical Empiricism, although he fell far short of being a radical skeptic of a Pyrrhonian stripe. For instance, Locke explained madness in mental terms rather than physiological ones, thus refraining from theorizing about its invisible or hidden causes.

In "Pyrrhonian Skepticism and Humean Skepticism: Belief, Evidence, and Causal Power," Don Garrett takes issue with Richard Popkin's claim that Hume was a Pyrrhonist. Garrett remarks that Hume did not aim to provide equipollent considerations on both sides of all questions, that he did not claim to attain ataraxia (undisturbedness) through his investigations, and that an examination of Hume's theories of belief and evidence explains why he maintained that Pyrrhonism cannot have any constant influence on the mind and that, if it did, the Pyrrhonist could not act at all. Garrett also maintains, however, that an examination of Hume's discussion of causation (a topic Popkin did not tackle) reveals significant similarities between Pyrrhonian and Humean skepticism.

Vlasits, in "The First Riddle of Induction: Sextus Empiricus and the Formal Learning Theorists," compares Sextus's and Hume's arguments against induction, concluding that while Hume's fails to get to the heart of what is puzzling about that inferential procedure, Sextus's does succeed in this task. The puzzle in question is that "any partial enumeration seems to have a built-in instability," which "comes from the need to extrapolate beyond one's observations" (244).

Jens Haas and Vogt's "Incomplete Ignorance" argues that the state of mind of the inquirer who asks a question is neither ignorance nor knowledge, but that expressed in the title of their essay. Although the inquirer does not know the answer to the question, he has the tools to ask it, namely, proleptic concepts and knowledge. Although the authors remark that Pyrrhonism has a lot to say about the issues they address, discussion of Sextus is limited to one short paragraph (257). Also, given the topic of the essay, I would have expected an engagement with Jane Friedman's several recent papers on inquiry, suspension, and interrogative attitudes -- in which Sextus's influence is readily detected and at times acknowledged.

The fourth and final part of the book consists of two essays. Richard Bett's "Echoes of Sextus Empiricus in Nietzsche?" explores both whether Nietzsche was influenced by Sextus and whether they could be viewed as philosophical allies. With regard to the first question, Bett remarks that the influence is possible but unproven inasmuch as, although Nietzsche read Sextus and mentions him several times, he does not seem to have taken any interest in Sextus as a philosopher. With respect to the second question, Bett finds some similarities: between Nietzsche's perspectivism and the Ten Modes, between Nietzsche's acceptance of a mundane and practically oriented science and Sextus's acceptance of certain technai, and between Nietzsche's moral anti-realism and Sextus's attack on ethics in Against the Ethicists. Let me make two minor remarks. First, Bett claims that a difference between Nietzsche and Sextus is that while the former questions the very idea of an absolute reality, the latter does not question the idea of a reality wholly independent of us (282-284). Though he presents this interpretation of Sextan Pyrrhonism as if it were unanimously accepted, it has actually been challenged by several specialists. Second, he fails to mention the scholarly studies that have called into question his controversial interpretation of the kind of skepticism expounded in Sextus's Against the Ethicists.

In the final essay, "Value Disagreement, Action, and Commitment," Sergio Tenenbaum engages with what he calls "moderate commitment skepticism," according to which the fact of persistent ordinary disagreement about value should lower our confidence in our evaluative judgments, so that any action based on those judgments is unjustified. He argues that "some form of practical certainty resists the argument from disagreement" inasmuch as "Kant's view about our awareness of the moral law provides a way of accepting that at least an important core of our practical knowledge can warrant full commitment to action" (292-293). Although the phenomenon of widespread and enduring value disagreement occupies a prominent place in Sextus's works, Tenenbaum does not engage with Sextus's discussion of that phenomenon. Moreover, Tenenbaum's concern is related to the concern of those who in antiquity leveled the charge of inaction (apraxia) against both Pyrrhonian and Academic skeptics, according to which radical skepticism is incompatible either with action tout court or with certain kinds of action (moral, prudential, or rational). Sextus agrees with Tenenbaum that there is no "suspension of action" (295), but observes that the skeptic makes practical choices by following the various ways things appear to him (PH 1.21-24). Given that these appearances are non-epistemic, the skeptic refrains from affirming that any course of action based on them is epistemically justified. Unfortunately, Tenenbaum does not analyze this skeptical reply to the inaction objection, limiting himself to remarking in a note that "the examination of ancient skeptics' views on how to live their skepticism is beyond the scope of this essay" (309, n. 13). Given the aim of the volume, this is precisely the kind of examination one would have expected.

Has the editors' twofold aim referred to at the outset of this review been attained? Only partially: while some chapters have shown the (possible) influence of Sextan Pyrrhonism on certain figures in the history of philosophy or its relevance to some issues in contemporary epistemology, others have either not engaged with it at all or done so only superficially.

[1] Editor’s note: NDPR has reason to doubt the accuracy of some of the empirical claims in the second paragraph of this review. We are not in position to verify the empirical claims, but we flag the issue for readers.