Epistemology and Political Philosophy in Gilbert Simondon: Individuation, Technics, Social Systems

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Andrea Bardin, Epistemology and Political Philosophy in Gilbert Simondon: Individuation, Technics, Social Systems, Springer, 2015, 215pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789401798303.

Reviewed by Donald A. Landes, Université Laval


The work of French philosopher Gilbert Simondon has long been on the verge of becoming of central concern in several different and often disconnected areas of philosophy. From the direct contributions it promises in philosophy of biology, psychology, technology, in metaphysics, epistemology, social and political philosophy, and in contemporary French philosophy, to the increasing number of important commentators who have drawn upon Simondon's rich and at times difficult philosophical lexicon for inspiration in their own research (Bernard Stiegler and Elizabeth Grosz, among others), the moment is certainly at hand to justify a generalized study of Simondon's philosophy. And yet, entering into the philosophical universe of Simondon, however inspiring and exciting it may be to the already initiated, is not a task without its difficulties. Simondon draws on and subtly reworks an incredible number of conceptual resources, often offering his reader fleeting references and definitions that quickly morph into the conceptual apparatus that is taking shape through his investigation itself. He enacts an individuating operation of what he might call a "transductive" movement in the becoming of knowledge arriving at a new metastable equilibrium. (And even this characterization reveals one of the difficulties of writing on Simondon -- the initiated reader will take up the language, the uninitiated reader will be lost in the wash of terms!). The nature of Simondon's work thus fully justifies the various attempts to offer a broader readership a foothold in Simondon's work (see for instance Barthélémy 2005, 2008; Chabot 2012; and Combes 2013).

Yet like any emerging school of thought, Simondonian scholarship has emerged as an important critical hermeneutic enterprise in its own right. In this excellent book, Andrea Bardin demonstrates that without a careful consideration of the diverse sources from which Simondon draws his concepts, the cascading conceptual apparatus of Simondon's philosophy itself will be at least partially lost even on the initiated reader. In short, Bardin has identified an essential region of Simondonian scholarship, continuing in important ways the work of Jean-Hugues Barthélémy (2008). This is perhaps the most valuable contribution of Bardin's book -- its nearly exhaustive reconstruction of the essential aspects of Simondon's philosophy via a wide-ranging examination of where the ideas came from, what the problems were to which Simondon saw in these concepts an answer, and even where this line of thought could go further. Although at times Bardin aims to present Simondon from scratch, for the most part his arguments and strategies presume a reader already somewhat initiated in Simondon's philosophy (and not really in classical "Epistemology" or "Political Philosophy," which are named in his title). As such, Bardin's book offers an invaluable and nuanced exploration of the metastable structures that shaped Simondon's own field of potentials and the philosophical milieu in which Simondon confronted problems that called for the crystallization/invention of his own philosophical thought. In short, Bardin seems to offer a genuinely Simondonian analysis of the individuation of "Simondon." As such, this text should be approached as an important contribution in Simondonian scholarship and thus of particular interest to readers of Simondon, who will benefit greatly by following Bardin "back to the sources" of Simondon's ideas and evolutions, or, alternatively, to readers of Simondon's interlocutors who are interested in exploring the potentials and shortcomings of these thinkers (a diverse group indeed, including: Bergson, Canguilhem, Merleau-Ponty, Norbert Wiener, de Broglie, Goldstein, Freud, Jung, Marx, Leroi-Gourhan, Mauss, and Durkheim).

As many commentators on Simondon's work have noted, an important extrinsic factor has shaped the reception of Simondon's work: the "editorial vicissitudes" (to use Bardin's term) of the publication of his central thesis, L'individuation à la lumière des notions de forme et d'information. Completed in 1958, various parts of it were published separately, but the unified text (with appropriate accompanying apparatus) was not available until 2005. Perhaps for this reason as much as any other, Simondon is often primarily associated with the philosophy of technology through his secondary thesis, also from 1958, Du mode d'existence des objets techniques, a book that was immediately available in toto. Often a key concern of commentators has been to introduce Simondon's complex philosophy of individuation in its biological, psychic, and collective forms in order to place it into relation with the account of "concretization" as it appears in the technological milieu. Bardin's explicit intention is to offer his reader a unified picture of Simondon (insofar as "unified" is reworked within the philosophy of individuation!). He does so not by extracting a "core" Simondon from these two sources but rather by enlarging the scope of Simondon's oeuvre under consideration so as to offer a much more complete reconstruction of Simondon's work as it emerged and evolved over the years beyond the two major works mentioned above. The book's appendix includes a chronological bibliography of Simondon's works, and Bardin's text makes good use of most of these works in order to provide one of the most complete accounts of Simondon's thought available. Bardin has clearly developed an intimate familiarity with all of Simondon's oeuvre, and this has allowed him to draw upon these various sources as crystallizations of Simondon's ongoing individuating philosophical thought as it negotiated the evolving philosophical milieu.

Bardin presents Simondon via three broad sections: 1) a study of both the ontology and epistemology of "individuation"; 2) an exploration of Simondon's account of biological and social systems; and 3) an examination the intertwining implications of the resulting philosophy for the study of human nature (and "human progress"), technics, and politics. I'll offer just a brief look at what is accomplished in these three broad sections.

In Part I Bardin sets out to clarify the ontological and epistemological status of the concepts Simondon employs. As mentioned, these concepts are often drawn from scientific thought (quantum mechanics, thermodynamics, cybernetics . . . ), but ultimately undergo a Simondonian reworking so as to further his unfolding understanding of individuation. The first chapter in this section presents a partial reconstruction of Simondon's philosophical lexicon. Bardin does a particularly good job in parsing the terms "individual," "individuation," "individualization," and the "process of individuation [ontogenesis]." As Bardin argues here, understanding Simondon's jargon requires grasping how his terms respond critically to traditional philosophical concepts (such as "substance," "essence," "individual," "form/matter," and "causality"). For Simondon, the tradition has failed to recognize that the individual is not simply a self-identical entity but rather simultaneously a "structure" and an "operation." That is, philosophers have failed to recognize that a study of individuals as "static, self-identical entities" fails to grasp the genuine reality of individuating systems as phase-shifting metastable equilibriums. As Bardin rightly stresses here, Simondon's insight into the complex reality of individuating systems requires a simultaneous resistance to any reductionism in psychology or sociology and even "a complete overhaul of the methodology of the social sciences" (6). This necessitates rebuilding both our ontological assumptions and our epistemological methods simultaneously, a process that Simondon accomplishes via his allagmatics (theory of operations) and by developing the cybernetic concept of "information" and the new logic of transductive operations (or transduction more generally). Exploring all of these terms and their interrelated potentials is the task of Bardin's subsequent chapters.

The rest of Part I initiates what I mentioned above as one of the most valuable results of Bardin's research: the "going back to the sources" approach that marvelously reveals the metastable field from which Simondon's thought crystallized. Chapter 2, for instance, reconstructs the Simondonian reformulation of the Gestalt notion of "form" and the cybernetic notion of "information." Bardin demonstrates how Simondon attempted to find a theoretical apparatus capable of unifying all sciences, including the human sciences, through what Bardin calls a "'biological' reform of the technological concept of information" (33). Chapter 3 adeptly reveals the influence (positive and negative) of Merleau-Ponty and phenomenological thought on Simondon's work, and Bardin nicely weaves into this exploration of sources Simondon's introduction of the term "pre-individual" and the phase structures of individuation. Simondon's shift to systems was accompanied by a deep suspicion that any phenomenological tendency would return to a philosophy of sense and thus of consciousness. This glance at the phenomenological influence on Simondon transitions into Chapter 4, where Bardin explores how the "subject" (which is not identical with the "individual") emerges in Simondon's thought. The reader of Simondon will greatly benefit from Bardin's exploration of these themes in relation to the notion of the transindividual and the shift Simondon makes between "information" and "signification" when he turns his attention to the psychological/collective level of individuation. Also of note here is Bardin's important discussion of "analogy" and "transduction" (see Chapter 4). Thus, we simultaneously find the question quite rightly posed as to the ontological exploration and the epistemological status of a subject's ontological "knowledge" in the very philosophy of individuating. Bardin has hit upon an insightful manner of integrating Simondon's concepts, his method, and the looming ontological worry as to the status of what Simondon talking about.

One of the most fruitful discussions, and one that Bardin implicitly alludes to throughout the rest of the book, is that of a Simondonian notion of "invention" in light of Simondon's more general apparatus of transduction. Invention is a process accomplished by a "subject," which is wider than the "individual" and includes the pre-individual structures carried forward by the individual as she confronts the urgencies of the present milieu that call for a "transductive reaction." I have argued (Landes 2013) that this structure "analogically" (to invoke Simondon's term) gears into Merleau-Ponty's paradoxical logic of expression. Yet, rather than exploring the phenomenological legacy of this insight into "the transductive process as it presents itself at the level of thought" (59), Bardin connects this to the question of knowledge, such that knowledge is between pure discovery and pure invention. And further, epistemology requires an ontology of the knowing "subject" (again wider than the "individual), an analogical becoming of "what is known and the becoming of the [knowing] subject" (59, Bardin, citing Simondon). Bardin makes important steps in thinking of the term "subject" in Simondon, though perhaps more remains to be said in this direction.

In Part II Bardin turns his attention to the manner in which biological concepts in particular shape Simondon's theorization of social systems, and this section also begins to weave the role of technics into the account. Again Bardin quite rightly insists on the value found in returning to the "sources" of Simondon's concepts and problems, taking the time to explore Bergson's biological and social theories, Canguilhem's work on the philosophy of life, science, and technics, as well as the continuing importance of cybernetic concepts and Leroi-Gourhan's paleoanthropology. A particularly illuminating aspect of this section is Bardin's reconstruction of the Bergsonian inspiration for Simondon's use of the "closed/open" paradigm in characterizing the dual direction or process of the "transindividual." At this level, these are at once psychic and collective individuations, such that systems oscillate between closing to external pressures and opening from internal tensions. The biological thus becomes the guiding paradigm, but not the biological in the sense of the classical image of the individuated organism. This allows us to see the deep complexity at work in the social theory of Simondon, a theory of open and integrated ongoing individuations.

In Part III Bardin considers the various later developments of Simondon's thought, particularly how it relates to technicity, sacredness (and magic), and politics. In Chapter 9, Bardin provides an adept reading of Simondon's course Imagination et invention. In this course Simondon conceptualizes the "cycle of the image" in such a way that it precludes a philosophy of "sense" in which meaning is produced by individuals. For Simondon, sense emerges from relations of communication among organisms and milieus via "subjects" and evolving structures. Here we see again the role of Simondon's particular account of "invention" as an open ontogenesis. Symbolic production thus emerges through the paradigm of the organism-milieu relationship (155), and each "cycle" of the image (by which an image becomes significant for a group and is thus used in the construction of a community) at once suspends ontogenesis and also "de-organizes" again for furthering the trajectory of individuation. As such, "the act of invention is not essentially different from the modalities of organized growth characterizing organisms" (Bardin, citing Simondon, 155).

The unresolved question of Simondon's politics occupies Bardin in the final chapter. Bardin, rather than seeking to discover a latent political philosophy in Simondon's work, follows Stiegler in seeing "the question of individuation" itself as "entirely political." But Bardin goes even further, arguing that in fact there is "something actually political at stake" in Simondon's writings (217). To establish this point, Bardin emphasizes the function of "philosophical thought" itself in Simondon's work, since philosophical thought performs a destabilizing function in relation to social systems that tend toward maintaining stability. Thus, Bergson emerges as an important influence on the "political" thought in Simondon, and the social function of technicity that is the ongoing oscillation between "regulation and invention" shows again that the ontogenesis without end, ongoing becoming, is an essential aspect of normativity in Simondon's thought. This leads to Bardin's insightful conclusion that:

If thought is a transductive process that can only continue by propagating into new domains and determining their radical reconfiguration, its functioning and efficacy cannot be granted only once and for-ever. And also the continuation of philosophical thought's transductive history ultimately depends on the vicissitudes of the milieu through which it was and still is propagated. Hence the philosophical-political meaning of Simondon's two major works . . . can be finally clarified. Simondon's masterpieces appear in this light as two quite different outcomes of the same effort to continue the political action of philosophical thought on culture, the regulatory apparatus of social systems. (228)

The philosophy of individuation is itself an individuation and as such is a political act of responding to the ongoing call for new cultural metastable equilibriums. Simondon's practice then, as philosophical thought in Simondon's sense, is at once descriptive and normative. His books themselves are examples of the very processes of transduction that he is discovering/inventing via his ontological and epistemological contribution. For Bardin, this movement is something of a metapolitcs, an identification of the place of invention between the regulatory norms of culture and the ongoing questioning both from within via the internal tensions and from without via the evolving milieu that the system itself is in the process of (at least partially) restructuring.

Bardin demonstrates a deep familiarity with even the least known parts of Simondon's oeuvre as well as the sources and philosophical debates that set the stage for Simondon's investigations, and his book is thus an invaluable resource in the continuing and burgeoning study of this thinker. There are times when the author seems caught up in the joy of exploring the Simondonian system -- which is one of the reasons that certain moments will require a reader already initiated into Simondon's dense network of concepts -- and there are also a few moments where the English expression is strained, lending some further difficulties to this difficult investigation. Nevertheless, the positive contribution this book makes is remarkable, particularly through the integration of thinkers as diverse as Bergson, Wiener, Durkheim, and Leroi-Gourhan. Bardin provides us with a fascinating study in the metastable structure of "Simondon," and his contribution on the question of the political in Simondon is an important step in the future of Simondonian scholarship.


Barthélémy, J.-H. 2005. Penser l'individuation. Simondon et la philosophie de la nature. Paris: L'Harmattan.

Barthélémy, J.-H. 2008. Simondon ou l'encyclopédisme génétique. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France.

Chabot, P. 2012. The philosophy of Simondon: Between technology and individuation (trans: Krefetz, A. with G. Kirkpatrick). New York: Bloomsbury.

Combes, M. 2013. Gilbert Simondon and the philosophy of the transindividual (trans: LaMarre, T.). Cambridge: MIT Press.

Landes, D. 2013. Merleau-Ponty and the Paradoxes of Expression. New York: Bloomsbury.