Epistemology and the Regress Problem

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Scott F. Aikin, Epistemology and the Regress Problem, Routledge, 2011, 207pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415878005.

Reviewed by Kelly Becker, University of New Mexico


Scott Aikin's excellent book, Epistemology and the Regress Problem, is a thorough, engagingly written, and often humorous exploration, explication, and defense of a version of infinitism about justification -- the view that the structure of epistemically justifying reasons is infinite. While Aikin's proposals are bold, his aims are modest, given the reception of infinitism to date: "the baseline objective in this book is to work out a way for epistemic infinitism to appear better than obviously wrong" (ix). The book provides an overarching narrative to motivate infinitism, responses to many well-known problems, and development of Aikin's preferred variety of infinitism, a hybrid theory that includes foundational empirical support as necessary but insufficient for justification. With utter and all due respect for Peter Klein's seminal work in the service of infinitism, this book sets the new standard.

Infinitism is motivated in two primary ways in Aikin's book. One is via the regress problem. If justification requires having reasons for belief, and those reasons can be neither circular nor fully self-justifying, then, it seems, reasons must go on forever and not circle back on themselves. Klein (1999) famously captures these conditions in his Principle of Avoiding Arbitrariness, which requires reasons for every justified belief, including the justifiers themselves, and thus seems to rule out foundationalism; and his Principle of Avoiding Circularity, which says that no belief can be in its own justificatory ancestry, and thus seems to rule out coherentism. Aikin offers his own principles -- weak irreflexivity, transitivity, and weak asymmetry -- leading to the same infinitist upshot. Weak irreflexivity ends up playing an important role in Aikin's "impure" infinitism, which is also an impure foundationalism, because it allows that some beliefs may be self-supporting and hence reflexive, but such support is insufficient for justification. Putatively foundational beliefs are insufficiently justified, according to Aikin, because he also endorses both the Principle of Inferential Justification (PIJ) and the Principle of Justified Inferential Justification (PJIJ):

PIJ: S is justified in holding that p only if (i) there is some proposition, q, that S is justified in holding, and (ii) q provides S some supporting reason for p's truth. (14)

PJIJ: S is justified in holding that p only if (i) there is some proposition, q, that S is justified in holding, (ii) q provides S some supporting reason for p's truth, and (iii) S is justified in holding q to support p's truth. (18)

PJIJ introduces a demand for metajustification. But isn't that too stringent a demand? Why does justification require metajustification?

The answer comes through in the second primary way that Aikin motivates infinitism, the overarching narrative mentioned above, which is through his notion of aspirationalism:

those who are justified are those who are maximally intellectually responsible. In essence, if you really are justified in your belief, you can answer questions about what you know until there just aren't any more questions. But, as it turns out, there are in principle no final questions. (3)

One such question is to ask why one believes that one's reasons are good -- a meta-question. Of course, one need not accept Aikin's aspirationalism, but, on the other hand, it provides a clear vision of the point of justification in our doxastic lives, and thus we owe it to Aikin to see where his vision leads.

If infinitism is the upshot of reflections on constraints on the structure of justifying reasons, why does Aikin reject it in its pure form, according to which justification is conferred on belief solely by an infinite chain of reasons? The answer is that infinitism is subject to the Modus Ponens Reductio, wherein any belief can be deemed justified so long as it is the consequent of a potentially infinite chain of modus ponens inferences. A similar concern has long been a thorn in the side of coherentism: if all beliefs are solely inferentially justified, where is the requisite contact with the world that makes them candidates for truth? Aikin's answer is that inferential reasons are necessary but not sufficient for justification because there must also be some grounding in experience. This move constitutes a break from Klein's and Jeremy Fantl's "pure" versions of infinitism, both of which receive close scrutiny in chapter 3 of the book, a chapter which also includes a discussion of C.S. Peirce's infinitism.

This foundationalist condition is what makes Aikin's infinitism "impure". And while it resolves a major issue, it throws up another large hurdle for Aikin, which is the myth of the given. Aikin needs an account of the non-inferential, supporting role of experience in justifying belief. Chapter 4 is devoted to a defense of the given. The discussion is intricate and well wrought, but I can only give a glimpse of it. According to Aikin, the given in experience is forced on us, underived, and involuntary, such that its representational content is autonomous from belief. One forms a belief, supported by the given, only when one notices salient features of it. It is not propositional, for if it were it would stand in need of justification, but when picked out demonstratively, it is conceptualized -- that green appearance. It does not fully justify basic beliefs because all justification requires inference (as per PIJ).

But we've heard all this before, and still the myth of the given looms. How can the given be a justifier without standing in need of justification? I am not convinced that Aikin's response to the myth works, but neither am I convinced that it doesn't. After all, our empirical knowledge, if we have any, must be grounded in experience, and so there has got to be some way around the myth. Aikin's way is to say that the given only grounds or supports but does not fully justify belief: "the givens are a nondoxastic determining addition to the interpretive and inferential supporting inferences necessary for justification" (117). The given supports belief because when one is directly acquainted with something given in experience, beliefs about the experience are "conditionally infallible" (129). It is not entirely clear why Aikin claims that such beliefs are conditionally infallible, especially when he gives examples of false beliefs about one's own pain (119) and heat (135) sensations. Aikin defines conditional infallibility in a way that makes the thesis true, but perhaps just trivially so:

Conditional Infallibility: If S's belief that S is being appeared to X-ly is supported by S's acquaintance with S's being appeared to X-ly, then S is appeared to X-ly. (129)

On the other hand, Aikin could probably make do with a claim weaker than infallibility about the grounding relation between appearances and beliefs based thereon, for instance that such beliefs are reliably formed or enjoy some level of default entitlement. But regardless of how one characterizes the epistemic grounding for given-based beliefs, they are not justified with only that support, because there are in principle always challenges such that one might even question whether a subject is being appeared to in the way she believes, and successful responses require reasons. So Aikin attempts to escape through the horns of the myth's dilemma: the given does support basic belief because in "taking" it, one is directly acquainted with it -- that green appearance -- but it does not fully justify basic belief (that I'm having a green experience) because justification requires (propositional) reasons, nor does the given itself require inferential support because it is non-propositional.

But didn't Sellars show that 'given' or 'appearance' talk is parasitic on object-level talk? We first learn to pick out and describe things, and 'appearance' talk comes on the scene only when we learn to hedge our assertions. If object-level talk comes first, how can appeals to appearances justify it? Are they not merely an after thought at best? Aikin argues that this confuses pragmatic warrant for using appearance talk with epistemic dependence. One is pragmatically warranted in switching from the usual object-level talk to appearance talk when one is hedging one's assertion, but it's still the content of appearance that supports beliefs about objects and their properties. Indeed, Sellars's argument actually vindicates some notion of the given, insofar as it is explicitly contrasted with talk of objects and therefore presupposed in constructing the myth. One may typically arrive at appearance talk through a pragmatic inference from object talk -- "I'm not sure that it's green, but it appears that way, and so I should only say how it seems to me" -- but that in no way implies that one infers how things appear.

In the final chapter of the book, Aikin returns to his larger aspirationalist themes. Center stage is his commitment to antidogmatism. While antiskepticism has traditionally been the focus of epistemology, Aikin worries that the emphasis is misplaced, especially because dogmatism is a far greater evil than skepticism, all the more so when the target concept is justification rather than knowledge. Aikin is primarily interested in when one can rightly claim to know, not the status of knowledge per se.

I hope to have done some justice to Aikin's wonderful book. I haven't discussed several important arguments, notably among them Aikin's response to Klein's antifoundationalist dilemma. (The main move in reply here is that Klein's dilemma wrongly confuses S's required metajustification for why basic beliefs are justified with what actually justifies S's first-order, basic belief.) But here, I suppose, I should discharge my duty as critic. A natural focus would be Aikin's resuscitation of the given, but I'll leave appraisal of that incredibly vexed issue to the reader. Instead, I shall simply suggest a challenge to Aikin's aspirationalism. Not all of his illustrative examples, but some crucial, early ones seem to stack the deck in favor of aspirationalism. For instance, in chapter 1, there are two hypothetical discussions concerning three people's opinions about the best football running back of all time. Ignoring the details, it is quite clear that, with no clear fact of the matter, any reasons in support of a belief about the all-time best back will be met with challenges, and responses met with further challenges, and so on. All the justification in the world won't produce knowledge in such exchanges, and so it is no surprise that the argument could go on forever. What does aspirationalism look like when applied to cases where the goal is actually knowledge?

Even if Aikin's impure infinitism withstands challenges to its infinitist and foundationalist aspects, does the aspirationalism that underwrites it pass muster? No matter how theoretical the belief, if it's empirical, it needs some grounding in experience. But since experience can only ground or support but not justify belief, every even somewhat thorough dialectical exchange will ultimately involve a challenge to one's experience. Aspirationalism requires that we always be open to such challenges and be prepared to answer them. Putting these points together, infinitist aspirationalism entails that dialectical exchanges will often end up with an ultimately skeptical challenge to the veracity of one's experience. That may be appropriate for conversations between epistemologists, but surely, in the management of our everyday cognitive lives that aspirationalism is meant to inspire, the desire to answer all these challenges will soon, if not immediately, devolve into the ridiculous. "You're asking me to defend the reliability of my vision again? Didn't we talk about that yesterday? Are we going to have this conversation every time I assert anything?" Of course, conversations don't typically go that far, but on the aspirationalist account, this is where they end up. Note that I am not claiming that such questions are unreasonable or at least strange in ordinary discourse. I think Aikin would grant that. I'm wondering whether aspiring to manage one's cognitive life well implies taking the questions seriously whenever they come up. So far as I can see, this concern does nothing to undermine Aikin's theory, but it raises the question whether aspirationalism is anything to which a sane person would aspire. Exasperationalism?

But don't be exasperated. Read the book.


Klein, Peter. 1999. "Human Knowledge and the Infinite Regress of Reasons," Philosophical Perspectives 13: 297-325.