Epistemology in Classical India: The Knowledge Sources of the Nyāya School

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Stephen Phillips, Epistemology in Classical India: The Knowledge Sources of the Nyāya School, Routledge, 2012, 194pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415895545.

Reviewed by Christopher G. Framarin, University of Calgary


Stephen Phillips' Epistemology in Classical India: The Knowledge Sources of the Nyāya School is a valuable resource, especially for students of Hindu or Buddhist philosophy. Phillips offers an overview of the Nyāya pramāṇas, or knowledge sources, and Nyāya epistemology more generally. He uses Western analytic terminology to classify and clarify the material, and draws comparisons and contrasts with competing Indian schools. While the book is somewhat introductory -- it does not dwell long, if at all, on some of the most widely studied points of contention within Nyāya, or between Nyāya and its opponents -- it provides the references and resources for finding additional material in both primary and secondary sources. The book is successful in demonstrating the rigor with which Indian philosophers approach and attempt (or might attempt) to resolve matters of interest to philosophers today. For this reason, the book is useful to philosophers more generally.

The main focus of the book is the four pramāṇas, or knowledge sources, that Nyāya accepts: perception, inference, analogy, and testimony. Phillips discusses these in detail in chapters three, four, five, and six, respectively. The first chapter is introductory -- it provides some of the basic distinctions and definitions that Phillips utilizes throughout the book. The second chapter clarifies the notion of certification -- the process whereby an agent confirms that his belief is justified. The final chapter (seven) argues that Nyāya epistemology has replies to a number of objections drawn from the Western context. The book also contains a translation of Gaṅgeśa's chapter on analogy from his Tattvacintāmaṇi as an appendix.

In the first chapter of the book, Phillips argues that there are two types or "levels" of knowledge in Nyāya: unreflective knowledge (pramā) and certified knowledge (nirṇaya/siddhānta). Unreflective knowledge that p arises simply as a result of a subject "standing in the right causal relation to the truth that p" (5). A subject stands in the "right causal relation" to the truth that p, in this context, only if his belief that p (analyzed in terms of cognition[s], plus consequent dispositional properties [saṃskāras] [7, 9]) is generated by one or more of the four pramāṇas (which are always factive [12]).

Certified knowledge, in contrast, is knowledge that arises as a consequence of an agent confirming (certifying) that knowledge of the first sort is justified. An agent confirms his unreflective knowledge, in turn, by argument and/or identification of the source of the unreflective knowledge as a genuine pramāṇa (17).

I might have unreflective knowledge that Bob works at Starbucks, for example, as a consequence of a veridical perception that Bob works at Starbucks. I might have seen him operating the espresso machine there, for example, even though I am not aware that this is how I know that Bob works at Starbucks. I might wonder whether I saw him working there, or only heard this second-hand. It is only after I have determined the source of my knowledge that Bob works at Starbucks -- namely, my (veridical) perception that Bob works at Starbucks -- that I might have certified knowledge that Bob works at Starbucks (15). In some cases, certification of this sort is more complex. If there are reasons to doubt that Bob works at Starbucks -- another person's testimony, for example -- the process of certification might include arguments for the claim that Bob works at Starbucks, arguments against the claim that Bob does not work at Starbucks, and so on.

Phillips claims that Nyāya's acceptance of both unreflective and certified knowledge makes Nyāya epistemology both externalist and internalist, respectively. An agent might have unreflective knowledge that p without having "conscious access to [his] reasons for the belief" that p (13). This suggests that the account is a form of externalism (5, 13-4). In order to have certified knowledge that p, however, an agent must "have and be aware of a good reason for believing that p" (13). This, according to Phillips, implies that the account is a form of internalism.

In the second chapter of the book, Phillips begins to explain the process of certification, by which unreflective knowledge becomes certified knowledge. As I said, in order for unreflective knowledge to become certified knowledge, the agent must confirm that his unreflective knowledge is justified by means of argument and/or identification of the source of the unreflective knowledge as a genuine pramāṇa.

Minimally, the agent must identify the source of the unreflective knowledge as a genuine pramāṇa. In the running example, I might recall that I did in fact see Bob working at Starbucks. Additionally, I might confirm that my perception of Bob working at Starbucks was veridical. This might sound like a forbidding task, but since Nyāya presumes the veridicality of experience in the absence of counter-evidence, confirmation of the veridicality of perception -- or any of the other pramāṇas -- involves further argumentation only when there is apparent counter-evidence. The fact that I saw Bob working at Starbucks, then, is sufficient evidence for the truth of my perception, at least as long as there are no reasons to think that my perception or belief is mistaken. If, instead, there is seemingly reliable testimony that Bob is unemployed, or that I was dreaming, an additional process of arbitrating among the competing claims is needed. This might involve suppositional reasoning (tarka), which might involve pointing out implausible consequences of one claim or another.

In chapter three, Phillips discusses the pramāṇa of perception (pratyakṣa). One fundamental distinction in this chapter is the distinction between conceptual (savikalpa) and non-conceptual (nirvikalpa) perception. Nyāya accepts both (33-4), although Phillips claims that only conceptual perception (inference, and so on) plays a role in Nyāya epistemology (50). Unlike their Buddhist opponents, the Naiyāyikas are realists about concepts (35). Bessy's cowhood is a feature of Bessy herself. It is not merely an attribute that language users attribute to Bessy as a consequence of the concept's utility (as most Buddhists argue).

Furthermore, this attribute is directly perceivable, even if, in most circumstances, the perceiver supplies the concept from memory, rather than perceiving it directly. Ordinarily, the perception of a cow as a cow is explained in part by the perceiver's memory of past cows, along with certain reliable indicators of cowhood currently perceived. The first time one perceives a cow, however, memory can play no such role, and the cow is perceived as a cow "in the raw" (37).

The fact that memory plays this role in so much of ordinary perception is crucial to understanding the seemingly counter-intuitive Nyāya claim that recognition is strictly perceptual. My recognition of this object here as Devadatta is not fundamentally different from my recognition of this object here as a cow. Memory plays a role in the latter perception, yet it is strictly perceptual. Hence the fact that memory plays a role in the former does not entail that it is not strictly perceptual (39).

The fundamental concept in chapter four of the book ("Inference") is "the notion of an inference-under-pinning 'pervasion'," or vyāpti (51). To say that some property H pervades some other property S is to say that if some entity has property H, then it has property S as well (52). The standard example, simplified, runs as follows:

Premise One: The mountain has smokiness.

Premise Two: Whatever is smoky is fiery.

Conclusion: Hence the mountain is fiery (53).

Phillips points out that this theory of inference is part of Nyāya epistemology (as opposed to a doctrine belonging exclusively to Nyāya logic), since it is meant to explain how agents come to know facts on the basis of other facts (52). Indeed, it is important to keep this point in mind throughout the chapter, since Nyāya claims that inference "works" only for those who have the relevant background knowledge. It is important for Nyāya that a person who has no knowledge of instances in which smokiness and fire are co-present, for example, cannot be convinced by the argument above, even if it is sound (53).

In part as a consequence of this, Nyāya (along with other Indian schools) draws a distinction between analysis for oneself, and analysis for another (53-4). For Nyāya, the main difference between the two has to do with a possible divergence in background knowledge -- in this example, whether the subject knows that the mountain is smoky, whether he has sufficient experience of other things that are both fiery and smoky (such as a kitchen stove), neither fiery nor smoky (such as the sea), and so on. An additional consequence is that the third certification condition for inference (corresponding to the conclusion of the inference above), according to which "the subject must connect by reflection the pervasion [whatever is smoky is fiery] with the subject at hand [the mountain's smokiness, and hence fieriness]" (liṅga-parāmarśa) amounts to a psychological condition: the subject must realize (occurrently) that premises one and two entail the conclusion (55-6) in order for the inference to succeed.

The first and second certification conditions for an inference (corresponding to premises one and two above, respectively) are as follows. First, "The prover [smokiness] has to be known as qualifying the inferential subject [the mountain]." Second, "The prover [smokiness] as pervaded by the probandum [fieriness] has to be remembered" (55). Phillips considers the second condition in some detail. He points out that Nyāya distinguishes three types of inference: (1) those based on both positive and negative correlations (between prover and probandum), (2) those based only on positive correlations, and (3) those based only on negative correlations (62). An example of the first is an inference from the smokiness of the mountain to its fieriness based on both experiences of entities both smoky and fiery, and experiences of entities neither smoky nor fiery. An example of the second or third sort is an inference based exclusively on experiences of the first or second sort, respectively. These, again, are simply ways in which a specific subject might come to know a pervaded-pervader relation.

In chapter five, Phillips considers the pramāṇa of analogy. For Nyāya, analogy has relatively limited application. As Phillips says, "analogy is restricted in scope to a subject's learning the meaning of a word" (74). The paradigmatic example is one in which a traveler asks a local about the meaning of the word gavaya (buffalo), and is told that it is like a cow in certain ways (it is milk-giving, and so on). This causes the traveler to "know in general" what the word gavaya means, even though he does not yet know "how it is used," or "its reference" (75, 80). The latter are accomplished only by seeing an actual buffalo, which in turn allows (presumably) additional analogical knowledge to arise (79).

Chapter five also includes a summary of the three ways that word meaning is established, according to Nyāya. The meaning of some words is simply stipulated, as in the case of a parent naming a child. Others (the majority) are derivative. They are combinations of words, or derived from more basic verb roots. And still others are both conventional and derivative. The word paṅkaja, for example, means mud-born, and is used to refer to lotuses. It is mere convention that the word is used to refer to lotuses, rather than all or some other subset of mud-born entities. In order to understand the word, however, it is important to understand the more basic words that constitute it, since lotuses are indeed born from mud (76).

It is tempting to think that testimony (śabda) -- the subject of chapter six -- can be reduced to inference. Nyāya insists, however, that when a subject hears the true statement that p from a person of authority, S (83), he comes to know that p directly, rather than first coming to know that S said that p, and then inferring that p (82). Additional certification conditions for knowledge by testimony include the authority's well-meaning desire to communicate to the hearer, the hearer's language competency, and so on (84).

Nyāya offers at least three reasons for denying that testimony reduces to inference. First, the two pramāṇas have different certification conditions. In the case of testimony, the hearer need not have memory that one quality pervades another -- as in the universal premise of an inference (85). Second, testimony comes from someone else, whereas inference is typically "by oneself and . . . for oneself" (86). Third, an inference regarding the authority's trustworthiness is a condition of certified knowledge, but not, ordinarily, unreflective knowledge (86).

The rest of the chapter explains a number of Nyāya positions relating to word and sentence meaning. Nyāya claims that words themselves refer, and hence have meaning (88), but that only sentences communicate the connections among things, and hence the unity among those things to which the words that constitute sentences refer (89). Phillips explains the distinction, in Nyāya and most other Indian schools, between direct and indirect (figurative, lakṣaṇā) meaning, and Nyāya's (at times rather half-hearted) refutation of a distinct, third use of words, namely that of suggestion (dhvani) (94-5).

The final chapter of the book considers Nyāya's response to a number of objections to externalism drawn from the Western context, one of which I summarize and evaluate below.

Like many books on Indian philosophy, this one is rather difficult to digest on first read. Phillips' explanation of certification in chapter two, for example, leaves out the certification conditions for each of the four pramāṇas. Phillips eventually lists the certification conditions for inference and testimony in some detail. He does this, however, only in chapters four and six, and he never explicitly offers a corresponding list for perception or analogy. By the end of chapter two, then, the fundamental process by which a subject might confirm that his belief arose from a pramāṇa remains rather obscure, since in order to certify that my belief arose from the pramāṇa of perception, for example, often I must know the certification conditions corresponding to perception, and confirm that the source of my belief meets these conditions.

Additionally, Phillips never explicitly states what the object of non-conceptual perception is. Nyāya takes the object of a conceptual perception to be a particular qualified by a certain property (or properties). The object of a non-conceptual perception, in contrast, is the property itself, rather than the particular itself. Phillips' claim that non-conceptual perception ends the regress of "a grasping of a property through the grasping of another property" (37) implies this conception of non-conceptual perception, but Phillips never states this explicitly. Even students of Buddhist philosophy, however, are likely to assume that the object of a non-conceptual perception is the particular.

As I mentioned, Phillips claims that Nyāya epistemology is both externalist and internalist. It is internalist insofar as it requires that a subject "be aware of a good reason for believing that p" in order to certify his unreflective knowledge that p. To say that a subject must be aware of a good reason for believing that p in order to certify his unreflective knowledge that p is to say, minimally, that a subject must know that his unreflective knowledge that p arose from a pramāṇa. It might be, however, that a subject knows that his unreflective knowledge that p arose from a pramāṇa simply in virtue of standing in the right causal relationship to this fact -- that is, without knowing his reasons for believing that p arose from a pramāṇa. Normally a subject will identify the pramāṇa from which his unreflective knowledge that p arose by means of apperception. But since, as Phillips says, "apperception is a form of perception" (23), the subject might come to know the pramāṇa from which his unreflective knowledge that p arose by the same kind of means by which he came to (unreflectively) know, by perception, that p in the first place. To insist otherwise is to claim that the externalist cannot explain how a subject might know that he knows that p.

Phillips' argument, in chapter seven, that Nyāya epistemology meets Nozick's tracking standard also strikes me as unconvincing. Nozick describes a grandmother who believes that her granddaughter is still alive, as a consequence of seeing her granddaughter standing in front of her. If her granddaughter were not alive, however, she would believe this anyway, since everyone would tell the grandmother that the granddaughter was still alive, in order to avoid upsetting her. According to Nozick, in order for the grandmother to know that her granddaughter is still alive, her belief that her granddaughter is still alive must be "sensitive to the fact that p . . . It has to vary appropriately as we imagine possibilities where p is true or false" (99). The grandmother's belief is not sensitive in this way, since she would have the belief regardless of whether her granddaughter is alive.

Phillips argues that Nyāya epistemology avoids this problem as follows. Nyāya denies that the grandmother knows that her granddaughter is alive in those circumstances in which her loved ones testify (truthfully) that she is alive, since these same testifiers would deceive her if her granddaughter were not alive (99). This seems right. But from this it does not follow that the grandmother's belief that p is sensitive to the fact that p, since she would still believe that p in all possible circumstances.