Equal Recognition: The Moral Foundations of Minority Rights

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Alan Patten, Equal Recognition: The Moral Foundations of Minority Rights, Princeton University Press, 2014, 327pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691159379.

Reviewed by Idil Boran, York University


Those interested in moral and political philosophy over the last three decades will remember that questions pertaining to cultural diversity and minority rights dominated the literature during that period. The center of gravity was Will Kymlicka's compelling discussion and justification of minority rights within the framework of philosophical liberalism. The debate that ensued didn't just give rise to a constellation of philosophical arguments and positions. It created a global movement, giving inspiration to the then newly forming states of the post-Soviet era to rethink how politics of cultural identity could be integrated with principles of liberalism. Around ten years ago, however, scholarly interest in these theoretical questions was already starting to run its course. Many specialists who were associated with issues of liberalism and minority rights in the 1990's gradually began exploring new horizons of normative inquiry on justice as time went on. Some moved on to issues of global justice, and the role and status of state institutions and the relevance of borders for inquiry on justice. Others returned to the debates on egalitarianism and distributive justice, or other related themes.

Alan Patten's new monograph comes as a surprise. It appears just when a fully worked out attempt to move the literature forward on liberalism and minority rights was no longer expected. Those familiar with the literature will therefore find this new release intriguing, and may find it worth reading.

Patten's objective is to carve out a normative framework for minority rights by appealing to a conception of state neutrality, a core concept of political philosophy in the liberal tradition. The central question that guides the inquiry is: under what conditions is there a basis for a complaint on justice about the decline of a culture within the basic structure of the state (p. 149)? In responding to this question Patten develops a concept of equal recognition for cultural minorities. The idea is to confer to minorities, within a liberal democracy, strong cultural rights grounded in principles of recognition and accommodation. According to Patten, the justification of these moral rights follows from the principle of state neutrality. He tries to show how policies of accommodation of minorities can be best defended through an appeal to state neutrality. His account adheres to "full proceduralism", a robust kind of proceduralism to be distinguished from the standard minimalist liberal proceduralism.

The work, overall, is highly ambitious for several reasons. It is an attempt at a comprehensive theory of minority rights, starting from the initial questions that exercised the literature on minority rights, such as how to understand culture and why it should matter for inquiry on justice. It develops a core thesis around state neutrality and takes up the challenge of addressing all longstanding objections against any project of grounding minority rights within the framework of liberalism. But it is ambitious also because the formulation of the normative basis for minority rights is intended to be a re-statement that provides an alternative to the dominant formulation of minority rights, known as liberal culturalism. Liberal culturalism defends minority rights as a response to, and an offshoot of, liberal nationalism. This generates, as far as Patten is concerned, an alliance between minority rights and liberal nationalism that is "much too cozy" (pp. 5-6, 176). As a result, the model of minority rights that ensues is, for Patten, too invested in forms of minority nationalism. Equal recognition is presented as an alternative that intends to disrupt this "cozy alliance" (p. 176). Delivered from the grips of minority nationalism, the proposed alternative builds the justification of minority rights more assertively than does liberal culturalism on ideals of philosophical liberalism, such as state neutrality, individual self-determination, and pluralism about conceptions of the good.

The monograph opens with a splendid introductory chapter, which offers a detailed overview of the issues and the literature. It articulates a robust justification for the project, and defines its theoretical contours. It makes the case that questions of cultural diversity and minority rights are alive and well, and that a new and improved account is needed.

Chapters 2, 3, and 4 build the theoretical resources leading up to the formulation of the core thesis. Chapters 2 and 3 are concerned with background theoretical questions about culture and its relevance to inquiry in political theory. Chapter 2 reviews different ways in which culture has been conceptualized, and provides an account that will be used in the central argument. Chapter 3 is concerned with why culture matters for normative inquiry on justice. Chapter 4 develops the theoretical stance that gives support to the central argument. This is where the principle of state neutrality is taken up and tailored to the issue of cultural diversity. It is through this theoretical formulation that the justification of minority rights is intended to distinguish itself from existing accounts.

Chapter 5, "Equal Recognition", is the heart of the monograph. It presents the core thesis, explains its features, and defends it vigorously against objections. This is also the chapter that is the most compelling. Chapters 6, 7, and 8 take up substantive issues. They focus on language rights (chapter 6), and on the questions surrounding separation from a multinational state (chapter 7). And the closing chapter 8 focuses on perennial questions about cultural diversity arising from immigration in liberal democracies, with special interest in the normative status of immigrant communities as opposed to that of national minorities.

On substantive accounts, the book is likely to inspire some debate. Reflection on whether culture plays a primary role in people's lives by providing individuals with a range of options has always been central to scholarly debates on minority rights. Claims about compromised access to meaningful options unless a particular national culture is promoted and preserved through state institutions are highly intuitive. But these claims run into massive problems when put under scrutiny. The book can be read as a project of doing some house cleaning on this question and reformulating the normative basis for accommodation, not on the badness of cultural decline as such, but in relation to fairness of treatment of distinct cultures. Some, nevertheless, may remain unsatisfied with this shift. They may find, for example, that the idea of fair treatment of cultures in diverse societies nevertheless relies, at some level, on some residual account of culture providing meaningful options. In other words, while Patten's focus on state neutrality may appear too bold to those who are uncomfortable with state neutrality, to others it may not be bold enough.

Clearly, the book has important merits. It offers a systematic reformulation of minority rights on decidedly liberal grounds. Nevertheless, it remains wanting on some accounts. Relative to some of the masterpieces of the literature on multiculturalism and minority rights, to which it intends to respond (such as Kymlicka's much discussed and revered Multicultural Citizenship), this book is not exactly a page-turner. The writing is clear enough. But the extremely didactic style cuts down on its accessibility. The author has an overly controlled and guarded way of writing. Lengthy preambles for every point,made throughout each chapter, followed by synopses and then further preambles. The book could have been far more succinct and, therefore more enticing to readers, were these repetitive portions removed.

Not simply because of its stylistic features, but for its rigorous and systematic focus, the book is decisively for specialists. It thoroughly reviews the different positions that have been developed over the years. It presents a distinct thesis, and persistently defends it against objections. So, it will be of use to scholars who are interested in these questions. It could potentially be used in courses, preferably at the graduate level and in advanced research workshops on the topic.

The book inevitably will raise questions as to what motivated the author to publish this monograph now and not at the height of the debates on the subject. An ambitious restatement, such as this one, has the potential to rejuvenate the philosophical conversation on the subject. Whether or not this will happen remains to be seen. But such an outcome will be welcome, particularly if it inspires scholars to return to theories of multiculturalism, this time by contemplating new ideas tailored to new circumstances, and taking them to new heights.