Equaliberty: Political Essays

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Étienne Balibar, Equaliberty: Political Essays, James Ingram (tr.), Duke University Press, 2014, 365pp., $25.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780822355649.

Reviewed by Jonathan Joseph, University of Sheffield


This collection brings together different essays by Étienne Balibar. Although it spans a twenty-year period, the essays are concentrated on the antinomies of citizenship. In particular, this review will focus on the work that compares the idea of democratic power and rights with the institution of rights within the framework of the nation state. Balibar works to problematize the institution of citizenship. At the heart of the institution of citizenship lies a contradiction that is continually reproduced in relation to democracy. There is nothing natural in the relationship between citizenship and democracy, and yet democracy appears as the most natural form of citizenship.

Balibar coins the term 'equaliberty' to capture this contradictory unity. This, the title of the collection, points to the constant tension between the concepts of freedom and equality, or between social rights and liberty. This is partly captured by the belief that equality is economic or social while freedom is juridical-political and institutional. Balibar also address what he calls the pseudo-notion that the realization of equality occurs through state intervention, essentially through redistribution, whereas freedom is about limiting this intervention (38). In actuality, the history of modern citizenship represents a differential of continuous insurrection and constitution (3).

Balibar argues that the equation of freedom and equality is essential to the modern subjective remaking of right, but this cannot guarantee its institutional stability (52). It is intrinsically fragile and vulnerable, always subject to a differential of insurrection and reconstitution that no purely formal or juridical representation can encapsulate. Balibar suggests we combine the 'idea of this differential of insurrection and constitution with the representation of a community without unity, in a process of reproduction and transformation' (9).

The universalism of the Enlightenment is based on universal right to politics. However, philosophies of the Enlightenment can be divided into categories of the subject and the individual. The citizen of first modernity has a subjective possibility based on interiority and internalization of the law within self-consciousness and an objective possibility based on utilitarianism and observance of rules and conventions (109). The question today is what remains of universalism when its principle is denounced by theorists of liberalism and undermined by the relativization of the political borders within which it was being instituted. This is a question to be raised in relation both to politics itself and our conceptualization of it, and it gives the book its topicality.

This moves to the question of today's crisis. The advantage offered by Balibar's approach is that it goes beyond the question of whether crisis is simply the result of an assault launched by capitalism as an outside force, perhaps resulting from the dominance of finance or transnational capital. A different perspective on the crisis is provided by examining how it exacerbates the internal contradictions of social citizenship and, in particular, how the continuous progress of basic rights comes up against the articulation of individual autonomy. In recent times a gap has emerged between the prerequisites of freedom and those of equality, which were previously inseparably associated. This is perhaps the single most significant aspect of Balibar's thinking insofar as it is able to provide an insight into contemporary forms of crisis that relates them right back to the problems of modernity, offering a significant alternative to traditional Marxist understandings without necessarily rejecting the significance of the economy.

Hence Balibar engages positively with arguments such as Wendy Brown's that see current events driven by market deregulation as well as constant interventions by the state into civil society in order to create citizens who are grounded in a logic of economic calculation (21). However, he is not convinced by the universal applicability of this argument, believing Brown's theory of de-democratization to reflect the particularity of American society. Specifically we could talk of the peculiarity of geopolitical hegemony, an individualistic frontier ideology, and that the principle of universal social rights has never been fully recognized in the United States (24). More generally this relates to two very different paradigms -- utilitarian individualism and the republican community of citizens, or, put differently, the pragmatism and individualism of the Anglo-Saxon tradition and idealism or subjectivism of continental traditions (107).

Despite this skepticism towards the generalizability of an Anglo-Saxon logic, Balibar goes along with a Foucauldian understanding of governmentality as 'individualizing the individual'. Foucault shows how the modern state individualizes through disciplinary mechanisms and differentiated management of social practices. Such an approach, he argues, recognizes that the process of instituting norms is not something external to the construction of the universal and the institution of modern citizenship but that in fact the determination of norms of conduct is the hidden face of citizenship (124).

The current period with its governmentalizing logic is characterized by both the imposition of hierarchy and the promotion of individual inequality. Politics is constituted by an incessant encounter between its own egalitarian logic and a police logic (perhaps especially revealed today in struggles over citizenship rights). However, there is always hope in the fact that contradictory logics are continually reproduced. The confrontation of institutional logics, where law sanctions the universalizing force of obligation and social relations of forces including the moral and ideological, represents a permanent condition of politics (280). The contours of insurrectional politics require imaging the constitution of new modalities of citizenship combining spontaneity and institution, participation and representation. If we think of Balibar's engagement with the politics of Europe and the question of what it means to be European, then we immediately see the radicalism of such an argument, particularly in relation to attempts to legitimize European integration.

Although some of the essays in this book are fairly old, this is a timely publication. It identifies and expands upon a crucial tension within liberal citizenship that runs through the course of history, but which seems particularly prescient today, especially within Europe. As the gains of classical liberal citizenship are transformed by neoliberal strategies of governance as identified by Foucault, Brown and others, so the essential gaps, lacunae and tensions are exposed, indicating that struggle and contestation are always present and possible. The last sections of the book illustrate this in practice as Balibar expands on topics that are perhaps more familiar to a contemporary audience -- European citizenship, cultural and political issues, recent riots and the struggle for a democracy without exclusion. Rare for a book with such a philosophical argument, the connection to these issues is clear and prescient. Indeed, this continual problematization of the conditions for citizenship might be considered to be an exemplary manifestation of what it means to be a critical citizen.