Equality and Opportunity

Placeholder book cover

Shlomi Segall, Equality and Opportunity, Oxford University Press, 2013, 223pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199661817.

Reviewed by Blain Neufeld, University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


In this book, Shlomi Segall formulates a 'luck egalitarian' conception of justice and applies that conception to the policy areas of hiring, education, upbringing, and health. He also argues for the superiority of his conception of justice over rival luck egalitarian and 'relational egalitarian' views. While Segall's conception of justice strikes me as more plausible than the luck egalitarian alternatives that he discusses, I do not think that he scores any decisive points against the relational egalitarian approach to theorizing about justice.


Before summarizing Segall's main claims, an overview of the current state of debate within liberal egalitarian political philosophy may be helpful. Two families of liberal egalitarian conceptions of justice have emerged over the past few decades: luck egalitarianism and relational egalitarianism. Both families share a common ancestor: the account of justice presented in John Rawls's A Theory of Justice.[1] Luck egalitarians have understood their project, at least in part, as developing the implications of Rawls's comments on the 'moral arbitrariness' of the distribution of unchosen social and natural advantages in Theory[2] into a distinct approach to theorizing about justice, one that is egalitarian in nature but also sensitive to individual responsibility. According to luck egalitarians, roughly, the aim of justice is to neutralize any disadvantages that people are born into or acquire as the result of brute luck, disadvantages for which they are not responsible and consequently do not deserve. In a fully just luck egalitarian society, people would fare well or poorly solely in conformity to those decisions and actions for which they are responsible.

Despite helping to inspire luck egalitarianism, Rawls's conception of justice, 'justice as fairness,' is a form of relational egalitarianism. While not all relational egalitarians endorse justice as fairness, they generally follow Rawls's 'constructivist' approach to thinking about justice.[3] According to this approach, broadly speaking, principles of political justice should be understood as rationally constructed in order to specify the requirements of free and equal citizenship under conditions of relative scarcity. A fully just relational egalitarian society, then, is not one that 'neutralizes luck,' but rather one in which citizens relate to each other as social equals on the basis of mutual respect, and freely govern their lives on conditions fair to all.


Segall's book is divided into four parts. The first (chapters 1-3) develops his version of luck egalitarianism, the core feature of which is what he calls an ideal of 'radical equality of opportunity.' This ideal asserts the following:

It is unjust for one to be worse-off, over her life-time, compared to another, with respect to what ultimately matters to persons (e.g. welfare), to the extent that she is not responsible for being at that absolute level (of said ultimate good). This ideal holds across political borders, across families and within them, and at all ages. It follows that: (1) justice requires neutralizing all obstacles for which the agent is not responsible, that is, both social and natural; (2) the allocation of less-than-ultimate goods (such as jobs or university slots) is just when it offsets the said unjust inequalities in overall (e.g. in welfare) inequalities. (pp. 6-7)

I will note three things about this ideal. First, Segall claims that radical equality of opportunity is compatible with different views about what constitutes the appropriate 'currency' of egalitarian justice, such as resources, welfare, or capabilities. However, his discussion, including his application of the ideal of radical equality of opportunity to various policy issues later in the book, typically refers to welfare. When discussing Segall's version of luck egalitarianism, then, I generally will assume that welfare is the 'equalisandum' of justice.

Second, only inequalities amongst persons with respect to the currency of justice (welfare) stand in need of justification, and in the absence of adequate justification, rectification. An adequate justification can show either that the inequality in question is itself just, because it tracks the choices of the persons in question (specifically, those choices for which they rightly are held responsible), or that it is excusable, say, because rectifying it is not feasible, or would involve unacceptably sacrificing some other important value (e.g., autonomy) (p.  19). Thus there is a justificatory asymmetry between conditions of equality and inequality between persons. "It is unjust for one to be worse-off than others through no fault of one's own" (p. 42), Segall writes, but it is not unjust for one person to be equal to another because of brute luck. Hence, in contrast to some other luck egalitarians, like G. A. Cohen, Segall holds that "undeserved . . . equalities cannot be considered unjust" (p. 36). "Responsibility (and conversely, luck)," he contends, "only begins to play a role in egalitarianism in the absence of the one and only thing that egalitarians (qua egalitarians) care about, namely, equality" (p. 58). Segall's version of luck egalitarianism, then, places equality at its centre: it is fundamentally an egalitarian, not an anti-luck, account of distributive justice.

Third, Segall attempts to provide a second-person justification for his version of luck egalitarianism. This is an intriguing move. According to one prominent critic of luck egalitarianism, Elizabeth Anderson, luck egalitarians and relational egalitarians disagree with each other, ultimately, because they adopt or presuppose different justificatory frameworks.[4] Luck egalitarians think about justice from a third-person or impersonal perspective, according to which a society is just to the extent that it realizes a certain state of affairs, namely, a state in which any inequality (in welfare) amongst persons reflects no distributive role for brute (bad) luck. Relational egalitarians, in contrast, think about justice from a second-person or interpersonal perspective, according to which the demands of justice are those that citizens reasonably can make on one another, especially with respect to the shared social institutions for which they collectively are liable. (Thus Rawls, for instance, insists that political principles of justice must be justified in a way that satisfies what he calls the "criterion of reciprocity."[5])

Segall claims that Anderson is mistaken in her characterization of luck egalitarianism as necessarily resting upon some form of third-person justification (p. 23 n.31). Indeed, one of the main aims of chapter one is to explore "the requirements of second-person justification" (p. 18, Segall's italics). As Segall interprets these requirements, we are under a duty to justify any advantage that we enjoy over others, and, conversely, we have a right to demand a justification from any others who enjoy advantages that we do not. He writes: "One has a duty to justify any advantage one might enjoy, independently of whether one is responsible for it, and independently of whether one is in a position to rectify it" (p. 24, Segall's italics). This interpretation of second-person justification and its connection to equality helps explain why Segall thinks that only inequalitiesrequire justification: under conditions of equality, "nobody . . . is under a duty to justify herself," as there is nobody "in a position to demand a justification" (p. 26).

Segall applies his ideal of radical equality of opportunity to hiring in part two (chapters 4-5). His account is committed to non-discrimination, non-meritocracy, and monism. The commitment to non-discrimination rules out allocating jobs on the basis of morally arbitrary considerations (e.g., race). By 'non-meritocracy' Segall means that it is not a requirement of distributive justice that jobs be allocated to the most qualified candidates, even if such qualifications are obtained in a society that secures something like Rawls's principle of 'fair equality of opportunity.' (Segall notes, correctly I think, that Rawls's justification for this principle is, at best, incomplete (pp. 88-89).) This does not mean that we should hire, say, brain surgeons without regard to the applicants' skills. Rather, hiring the best applicants is not a requirement of justice, though it may be a requirement of some other important moral value, such as promoting wellbeing (or minimizing suffering), or pragmatic considerations like efficiency. By 'monism' Segall means that the ideal of radical equality of opportunity "does not accord jobs any privileged position . . . and therefore does not see them as distinct from all other goods" (p. 85). If the currency of justice is welfare, then jobs are simply one factor among many that can contribute to persons' welfare. Consequently, from the perspective of pure distributive justice, "the allocation of jobs must be used to equalize welfare across society" (p. 86, italics removed). Affirmative action policies are justified insofar as they correct for the unchosen inferior opportunities for welfare available to members of disadvantaged groups.

Part three (chapters 6-7) focuses on education and upbringing. With respect to education, the ideal of radical equality of opportunity requires that educational achievement vary with students' "effort and effort alone" (p. 142). This means that, "To be just, educational achievements need not, and must not, track talent" (p. 147). Once all unchosen factors have been neutralized, then students' different levels of educational achievement will reflect only their different levels of effort. Segall is keen to emphasize, though, that while 'pure' justice requires holding children responsible for their educational achievements (p. 142), the design of educational institutions and policies need to take into account other considerations, including "a principle of adequacy" (p. 143), considerations of efficiency (p. 144), and the goal of "preserving an adequate measure of autonomy throughout a person's life" (p. 149). This means that a morally desirable education system -- "an account of all-things-considered rules of regulation" (p. 151) for education -- will not conform exclusively to the ideal of radical equality of opportunity.

With respect to upbringing, Segall addresses an objection to luck egalitarianism, specifically, that it would prohibit parents from engaging in certain activities commonly taken to be important elements of parent-child relationships, like that of reading bedtime stories, if doing so exacerbates inequalities amongst children with respect to their future opportunities (for welfare). He writes: "The basic egalitarian intuition here seems to be that it is unfair for well-off parents to impart advantages to their children, thereby exacerbating socio-economic inequalities" (p. 155). Segall concedes that, focusing exclusively on the requirements of distributive justice, such activities by well-off parents are unjust. However, the realization of "family relationship goods" (p. 164) often can override the requirements of distributive justice. As in the case of education, then, the design of the rules of regulation for governing parent-child relationships will not be based exclusively upon the ideal of radical equality of opportunity.

Part four (chapters 8-9) addresses justice and health. Applying the ideal of radical equality of opportunity to health means that "It is unfair for individuals to suffer worse health than others owing to factors that they did not control" (p.177). Segall's discussion focuses on the distribution of health and not simply health care. Resources should be distributed so as to ensure, as far as is possible, that any disadvantages in persons' health reflect choices for which they are responsible (say, choosing to smoke), and not brute bad luck (like being struck by lightning). Moreover, radical equality of opportunity justifies "radical affirmative action" in health, according to which priority should be assigned "to those whose need is caused by an ex ante worse-off health prospect, whether generated by social or natural factors" (p.204).


Segall states that one of his aims is to show that the ideal of radical equality of opportunity can serve "as an attractive guide to justice in major areas of social policy" (p. 12). But as my summary of his discussions of hiring, education, and upbringing indicate, he emphasizes that the demands of pure distributive justice need to be weighed against other normative considerations, such as the values of autonomy and family relationships, as well as accommodate feasibility-related considerations, in order to yield appropriate 'all-things-considered' rules of regulation. Thus, while he explains what his conception of justice, taken in isolation, might require with respect to certain topics, we end up with little in the way of actual policy guidance. And to the extent that Segall considers how to weigh the demands of his conception of justice against other considerations, such as those of autonomy and efficiency, in order to formulate policy-guiding rules of regulation, his comments generally are tentative and incomplete.

Because Segall's book includes only provisional suggestions of how to weigh the demands of his conception of distributive justice against other considerations in order to generate overall rules of regulation, it is difficult to compare that conception to the main relational egalitarian alternatives, such as Rawls's conception of justice as fairness. This is because Segall's characterization of the normative subject matter of justice is muchnarrower than that of most relational egalitarian conceptions of justice. He holds that autonomy and mutual respect, for instance, are not elements of distributive justice, and indeed sometimes must be traded off against the requirements of justice, along with considerations of efficiency and feasibility, in formulating morally desirable overall rules of regulation. In contrast, relational egalitarians like Rawls hold that political autonomy, individual freedom, mutual respect, feasibility, and efficiency are all components of justice. Relational egalitarian conceptions of justice, then, correspond roughly to Segall's rules of regulation (or at least those rules that apply to what Rawls calls the 'basic structure of society.')

The difference here, I think, reflects relational egalitarians' commitment to constructivism, according to which principles of justice are formulated with the aim of specifying the conditions that social institutions and practices must satisfy in order for persons to relate to one another as free and equal citizens (say, by determining whether those principles would be endorsed by rational parties within a hypothetical contract situation like Rawls's 'original position'). Given its role, justice, on this view, must incorporate into its content considerations of mutual respect, political autonomy, individual freedom, and so forth. Facts of human psychology, institutional feasibility, economic efficiency, and the like, also help to shape the content of justice according to relational egalitarians. This is because a conception of justice is constructed in order to structure fairly persons' relations with one another qua citizens within their shared social world. In contrast, Segall follows G. A. Cohen in understanding distributive justice to be about only equality, and not other normative ideas like autonomy and mutual respect. Segall also follows Cohen in understanding the nature of justice in a non-constructivist, 'fact-independent' way.[6] On this 'Platonic' construal of the nature of justice, roughly, pure justice is not in any way based upon (and cannot incorporate into its content) facts, including facts about human psychology and social institutions, although facts will help determine how best to realize justice in any particular circumstance (by informing the formulation of the relevant rules of regulation).

I should note that Segall is not wholly unaware of this difference between his view and that of relational egalitarians. In a long footnote in chapter 7, he discusses Andrew Mason's claim that their different views concerning the relation between justice and parental partiality follow from a more basic difference between them concerning the correct "method of theorizing about justice." Roughly, Mason holds that a variety of different considerations, including those of "legitimate partiality," should be included when "constructing an ideal of justice," whereas Segall, explicitly following Cohen's approach, insists that we should "search for what justice, pure and simple, requires, and then examine whether the requirements of justice clash with other moral values" (pp. 159-60, n.14).

That footnote aside, though, I think that Segall's discussion generally does not take into account adequately the fact that -- because his conception of luck egalitarian justice treats as external to justice many considerations that relational egalitarians regard as internal to justice -- what relational egalitarians call 'justice' more closely corresponds to what he calls 'rules of regulation.' It consequently is difficult to assess his luck egalitarian conception of justice and its policy implications vis-à-vis the main relational egalitarian alternatives without a clearer picture of what Segall takes the relevant sets of (all-things-considered) rules of regulations to be. And as mentioned earlier, to the extent that Segall discusses overall rules of regulation, his comments seem speculative and incomplete.


The most philosophically provocative aspect of Segall's discussion in part one is, I think, his attempt to provide a second-person justification for his version of luck egalitarianism. Unfortunately, the account also strikes me as implausible. For one thing, it is not clear how his second-person justificatory framework coheres with his non-constructivist, fact-independent conception of what justice is. According to the Platonic conception of what justice is that Segall shares with Cohen, justice simply is what justice is, irrespective of what human beings think about it, and it is up to us to try to discover the true, fact-free content of justice, and apply it as best we can to our lives (via the appropriate rules of regulation). Segall's version of second-person justification can appeal, at best, to this independent standard of justice, but it plays no role in determining the content of justice. In contrast, second-person or interpersonal justification is taken by many relational egalitarians to play an essential role in the rational construction of a conception of justice. Thus, Segall's version of second-person justification, insofar as it is meant to be compatible with his Platonic conception of the nature of justice, is not one, I think, that most relational egalitarians will find compelling.

Another problem with Segall's version of second-person justification, at least from a relational egalitarian point of view, concerns his characterization of the relevant 'justificatory community' within which demands regarding justice can be made. He writes, "We may think of the source of this [interpersonal] duty [of justification] as one which follows from our common membership in a justificatory community" (p. 22). This claim looks correct: it is because a particular relation exists among certain persons that duties of mutual justification apply to those persons vis-à-vis that relation. Yet Segall's conception of the justificatory community in question is incredible. He holds that all members of humankind, throughout all of time, are members of this community, and thus under a duty to justify any inequality that might obtain between any of them. "I have a duty to justify to a fourteenth-century Inca peasant," Segall writes, "my superior life expectancy and wellbeing" (pp. 21-22). This is an astonishingly broad conception of the justificatory community to which claims concerning distributive justice apply. What could possibly ground this conception? As far as I can tell, Segall simply stipulates that the relevant "moral community" is all of humankind throughout all of time (p. 23).

Segall contends that his version of the "interpersonal test (for assessing the morality of superior holdings) is something that relational egalitarians . . . should feel compelled by" (p. 23). But given the Platonic, non-constructivist nature of his conception of justice, and given the expansive scope of the justificatory community within which Segall's 'interpersonal test' applies, I doubt that many, if any, relational egalitarians will find this to be the case. This is because principles of political justice, according to relational egalitarians like Rawls, have to do with the kinds of normative claims that persons reasonably can make on one another in theirrelations with each other as fellow citizens. So for Rawls, principles of domestic political justice concern relations of fairness or reciprocity in citizens' cooperation with one another in maintaining the basic structure of their society. And while relational egalitarians generally focus on relations among persons qua co-citizens and the principles of political justice that apply to that relation, they do not deny that other principles, including principles of justice or rightness, can and should apply to other kinds of relations.[7] However, I think that Segall's construal of the relation that gives rise to a duty of second-person justification, and consequently duties of distributive justice, to encompass all human being throughout all time, stretches the notion of 'relation' implausibly far. Consequently, I see no warrant for Segall's claim that relational egalitarians "should feel compelled by" his account of second-person or interpersonal justification.


For the reasons outlined in sections 3 and 4 of this review, I do not think that Segall's arguments place any pressure on relational egalitarians to rethink their approach to theorizing about justice. But if one must be a luck egalitarian, then the version that Segall advances strikes me as the best one currently on offer. Moreover, his account of justice and its implications is presented in a clear and concise manner. Irrespective of whether one is a relational or luck egalitarian (or not an egalitarian at all), the book is a great resource for understanding the current state of debate within liberal egalitarian political philosophy.

[1] J. Rawls (1999), A Theory of Justice, revised edition (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press). (Original edition published in 1971.)

[2] See Rawls (1999), pp. 63-65, 87-89, 274.

[3] Some relational egalitarians, like Elizabeth Anderson, prefer to speak of 'contractualism' rather than 'constructivism.' I understand contractual devices like Rawls's 'original position' to be constructivist in nature. But this matter is not relevant to my discussion here. Everything that I say about constructivism can be restated in contractualist terms.

[4] E. Anderson (2010), "The Fundamental Disagreement between Luck Egalitarians and Relational Egalitarians," Canadian Journal of Philosophy (Supplementary Volume 36), pp. 1-23.

[5] J. Rawls (2005), Political Liberalism, expanded edition (New York: Columbia University Press), p. xliv.

[6] See G. A. Cohen (2008), Rescuing Justice and Equality (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press), Part II.

[7] Hence Rawls claims that distinct conceptions of justice apply to (a) local associations, (b) the domestic basic structure of society, and (c) the global domain (J. Rawls (2001), Justice as Fairness: A Restatement(Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press), p. 11f).