Equality and Tradition: Questions of Value in Moral and Political Philosophy

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Samuel Scheffler, Equality and Tradition: Questions of Value in Moral and Political Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2010, 343pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195396294.

Reviewed by Jon Garthoff, Northwestern University


Two principal virtues of written philosophy are clarity of presentation and depth of engagement with the subject matter, and few philosophers equal Samuel Scheffler's ability to realize these virtues simultaneously. Equality and Tradition is a collection of Scheffler's recent essays in moral and political philosophy. The book is both a worthy successor to his previous books and collections and an excellent entry point into the most recent literature in these fields.

The influence of John Rawls on Scheffler is more apparent in this volume than in his past work. While Scheffler has long been recognized as among the most astute readers of Rawls, these essays mark him more clearly than previous work as, in important respects, a follower of Rawls. This is to say neither that he is uncritical of Rawls nor that this collection contains much exegesis of Rawls. But a sensitivity to the subtlety of Rawls's work and an acceptance of Rawlsian ways of framing central questions of normative philosophy pervade this collection.

Scheffler divides the chapters into subgroups: three on individuals, three on institutions, and six on society. In my discussion here I follow him in this organizational structure, though I comment only briefly on the first subgroup, since I find Scheffler's claims in this section largely persuasive. The first essay concerns the nature of valuing, which Scheffler argues is an important and distinctive attitude not reducible to desiring or believing valuable. The second essay makes this account of valuing more specific by explaining the three principal objects of our valuing: personal projects, interpersonal relationships, and group memberships. This essay notes the appeal of, and also registers some sensible skepticism for the strategy (notably deployed by T. M. Scanlon) of grounding a conception of moral obligation in the value of a kind of interpersonal relationship. The third essay defends the significance of the commonsense distinction between doing and allowing.

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The guiding idea behind the three essays on institutions is that political philosophers should focus on major social and economic institutions -- what Rawls labeled the "basic structure of society" -- because there are distinctive values that can be realized only when these institutions are properly organized. The relevant values are justice, fairness, equality, and the like. Scheffler's distinctive contribution here is to frame this as a claim about value pluralism. In his view there are values, discussed in the context of the essays on individuals, whose realization requires that individuals not give equal concern to everyone's needs. These stand in tension with values like fairness and equality which require that everyone's needs have the same force. These latter values cannot be realized individually without doing violence to values that depend on partiality, and Scheffler suggests this is why they must be realized through the basic structure.

This is a promising suggestion, and it is consonant with the spirit of Rawls's own reasons for focusing attention on the basic structure. As Scheffler notes in the fourth essay, "The Division of Moral Labor: Egalitarian Liberalism as Moral Pluralism", this moves away from the thought that the focus on the basic structure is meant to shield individuals from the burden of responding to the needs of others. It instead grounds this focus in the more appealing thought that there are distinctive values which can be realized only by relating to others through a properly organized basic structure.

One difficulty with this suggestion, however, is that a move to a pluralistic rationale for focusing on the basic structure raises questions about why the distinctive values to be realized through the basic structure should enjoy systematic normative priority over the values that are realized individually. While this worry is not given sustained attention in this collection, Scheffler is in good company in inviting it: Rawls's own account of why justice should enjoy systematic priority with respect to other values is itself somewhat obscure.

In the sixth essay, "Cosmopolitanism, Justice, and Institutions", Scheffler applies his pluralist rationale for focusing on the basic structure to the case of global institutions. He attempts to move past debates about whether there is a global basic structure by arguing that even if there is not, existing institutions give rise to their own requirements of fairness and equality. The moral constraints on these institutions are not the same as those regulating a full-fledged basic structure, and on Scheffler's view the only way to identify these moral constraints is to attend carefully to the actual institutions.

This understanding of the moral constraints regulating global institutions may understate, however, the pressure within moral theory towards a global basic structure. At the national level we need a basic structure for various moral reasons. These include the need to give specific content to moral obligations and entitlements and the need to protect individuals in need from objectionable dependence on benefactors. Scheffler follows Rawls in first asking questions of sociology -- What sorts of institutions do we have? -- and only then asking questions of moral theory -- What sorts of moral constraints regulate institutions like those? Scheffler thus also follows Rawls in leaving unstated specifically moral pressures towards creating a basic structure when we lack one. Indeed, the same moral pressures towards having a basic structure at the national level appear to apply at the global level, since the moral problems at the global level are not of a wholly distinct character. Individuals must have moral obligations and entitlements with specific content if they are to adequately respond to poverty and pollution, for example, and arguably only a basic structure can accomplish this fairly.

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The subgroup of essays on society is the longest and most diverse, and I cannot here comment on all the topics Scheffler takes up within it. In two essays on luck egalitarianism he makes a persuasive case that the guiding intuitions behind luck egalitarianism are not those that underlie Rawls's understanding of justice. Scheffler also persuasively argues that: (1) Rawls understands justice to be about the structure of the social relationships by which we produce and distribute goods, rather than about the bare facts about concerning who has goods; and (2) this understanding of justice is richer than its rival. I can also recommend Scheffler's careful and sensitive essay which offers an affirmative response to its title question: "Is Terrorism Morally Distinctive?"

The last three essays focus on whether and how cultures and traditions constitute norms. Scheffler's general claims, here as everywhere, are sensible: he contends we have a tendency to overstate the normative significance of cultural membership, but he allows that such membership is not completely normatively inert. In defending the first claim Scheffler may rest too much weight on the fact that cultures are not, as he puts it, "perceived sources of normative authority" (p. 281) in the way that many moral and religious convictions are. One concern here is that in resting weight on perceived normative authority, which is present even when moral and religious views are unreasonable, we may abandon resources needed to explain why many claims within the moral and religious domains lack genuine normative authority. While Scheffler rightly stresses the fluidity of cultures as a limitation on their normative force, he does not raise the concern that even a conception of cultures as fluid may ascribe to cultures too much normative significance. If it is a pervasive feature of human societies that people are excessively resistant to social change, for example, then it may be problematic to take cultures as sources of norms even where people are not tempted to ossify current cultural forms.

Scheffler presents resources that may blunt this charge in the intriguing eleventh essay, "The Normativity of Tradition", in which he argues that there are normatively significant features of traditional practices. Scheffler enumerates these features with a rare insight into the human condition, though he does not attempt to explain fully their systematic connections. Some of these features are more or less familiar accounts of the social virtues of regularized and conventional action. More distinctive is Scheffler's discussion of the value of routine, of repetitive and familiar activity. He suggests that routine activity gives us a sense of having a home in time and thereby limits our sense of powerlessness in the face of our lack of control over time. (I note in passing that his discussion contains no reference to work on similar themes within the phenomenological tradition.) We can move through space and we can create sections of space -- homes -- that belong to us and have familiar features well-suited to our tastes.

But as Scheffler observes, we are more limited in our ability to domesticate time, since both our position in it and our movement through it are almost entirely -- the exception being the option of suicide -- beyond our control. Scheffler proposes that routines enable us to achieve the closest thing we have to a home in time by making familiar events recur at regular intervals. He proposes further that traditions, which may include rituals and other routine activities shared with other people, including people in the distant past or future, enable us to have a greater sense of what it would have been like to live in other times and places. This limits the otherwise overwhelming powerlessness accompanying recognition of our own finitude and the inevitably of our own deaths.