Equality for Inegalitarians

Placeholder book cover

George Sher, Equality for Inegalitarians, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 182pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521251709.

Reviewed by Kok-Chor Tan, University of Pennsylvania


George Sher's book accomplishes two things. It provides a thorough critical survey of the account of distributive egalitarianism known as "luck egalitarianism", and it proposes in its place an highly original alternative view of distributive justice that takes the ability of each person to live his or her own life "effectively" to be the good of justice (p. 7). Sher's account of distributive justice is, in the first instance, concerned with sufficiency rather than equality since its goal is to ensure for each a sufficient amount of resources and opportunities and the like to live her own life effectively. Nonetheless, he holds that sufficiency in this regard is ultimately egalitarian because it also secures for each the "equal chance" to live her life effectively. Hence the "equality for inegalitarians" of his title.

Luck egalitarianism is a picture of distributive equality that, at its core, holds that a just distribution of the relevant goods ought not to reflect persons' good or bad luck, and that inequalities in distribution are acceptable only when they directly reflect personal choices. Sher parses this basic luck egalitarian commitment in terms of a pair of conjuncts (p. 1). One is an "egalitarian conjunct" that holds that inequalities among persons due to luck ought to be mitigated as a matter of justice. That is, this conjunct tends towards equality. The other is an "inegalitarian conjunct" that regards as justified those inequalities resulting from advantages or disadvantages traceable to personal choices. This conjunct specifies acceptable departures from equality.

To motivate his own account of distributive justice, Sher begins with a rebuttal of luck egalitarianism. The main thrust of his criticism is that luck egalitarians are hard pressed to account for the inegalitarian conjunct in light of their egalitarian starting point. What is it about personal choices that overrides the tendency towards equal distribution (p. 4)? Pluralistic versions of luck egalitarianism, as Sher labels them, do not attempt to offer a single principle that could explain both luck egalitarian conjuncts at once. Instead, they presume a duality of principles: on one hand, they posit an egalitarian principle that grounds the egalitarian conjunct and, on the other, they presume a distinct value-of-choice principle that grounds the inegalitarian conjunct. (Hence the pluralism). The central problem with pluralistic versions of luck egalitarianism, according to Sher, is that it is hard to square the commitment to choice with the commitment to equality. That is, the two conjuncts stand in a certain tension with each other. Indeed, since pluralistic luck egalitarianism lacks an overarching theory or principle that can explain what kind of inequality-inducing choices are acceptable and when equality should trump choice, it lacks a principled way of distinguishing inequalities that are just from those that are unjust (Chaps 2 and 3).

Monistic versions of luck egalitarianism attempt to unify both the egalitarian and inegalitarian conjuncts under a common principle. Although this avoids the internal tension that plagues pluralist luck egalitarianism, Sher believes that monistic luck egalitarianism also ultimately falls short. Monistic luck egalitarians (and here he takes Ronald Dworkin to be representative) typically invoke the idea that persons are moral equals entitled to equal respect as the unifying principle that supposedly supports both the luck egalitarian conjuncts. Yet, Sher argues, monistic luck egalitarians merely presume this idea of the moral equality, and it is unclear how this ideal in fact serves to underpin the luck egalitarian conjuncts (pp. 70-71). To the contrary, he believes that the ideal of the moral equality of persons on deeper analysis and elucidation tends towards his own account of distributive justice instead of luck egalitarianism (p. 6; p. 73).

The stage is thus set for Sher to mount his preferred account of distributive justice. Why do we believe that each person is a moral equal who is entitled to equal respect? According to Sher, this is because we take it that each individual occupies a "distinctive subjectivity" (p. 19; p. 80). That is, each person has a fundamental interest in living a life of her own that "is future oriented, active, reason-guided, and organized around an enduring though evolving set of aims" (p. 95) and to live that life successfully. It is this fundamental interest of persons that accounts for why we ought to treat individuals as moral equals. Sher refers to this fundamental interest as an interest each has in "living his live effectively" (p. 96).

This idea of "living one's life effectively", Sher argues, suggests an account of distributive justice quite different from that of luck egalitarianism. It is the case, he believes, that to live one's life effectively entails, among other things, taking responsibility for one's own choices. So one of the luck egalitarian conjuncts is affirmed by his ideal of living effectively. But luck egalitarianism's other conjunct has no place under this ideal. To the contrary, living one's life effectively will also require that one adapt and adjust to the vagaries of luck and make what one can of them. As Sher puts it, "living one's life effectively is largely a matter of coping with contingencies" (p. 126).

As Sher explains, to succeed in living her life effectively, the person has to be able to set her aims and adopt strategies in pursuit of these aims according to the circumstance she finds herself in. This is part of what it means to be responsive to reasons that one's given situation "provides" (p. 119). Misfortunes in life are the sort of things to be confronted as part of living well rather than things that persons are to be protected from or socially compensated for. By way of contrast, Sher's own account endorses the inegalitarian conjunct of luck egalitarianism, but rejects its egalitarian conjunct. For him, an agent's choices should "stick" and ought to count as among the things she could be held responsible for. But so, too, should an agent's luck. Part of living a life effectively is to be able to adapt to one's circumstances, and to play with the hand one is dealt. Sher's approach to distributive justice is thus a "perfectionist" one at bottom. It is founded on an understanding of what makes a human life successful or go well.

It must be stressed that Sher does not, of course, say that success in living effectively requires that a person suffer all of life's challenges with equanimity no matter how devastating. His is not a version of Stoicism that insists that personal virtue can ensure individual happiness regardless of the adversities of life. Sher is clear that individuals must enjoy a certain threshold of sufficiency with respect to three important classes of goods -- namely, resources and opportunities, education, and basic reasoning and judgmental capacities -- in order to be able to live their lives effectively (p. 164). What is important, however, is that it does not follow that everyone must have the same amount of goods in order for each to live effectively. Moreover, what counts as an adequate baseline of sufficiency is subjective in that it can vary inter-personally. For instance, one person may need more food resources than another -- perhaps because of health reasons -- to meet her own subjective threshold of being able to live effectively.

Hence, Sher's theory of distribution is in the first instance "sufficientarian" rather than egalitarian. Once all persons attain their respective threshold of sufficiency, it does not matter from the standpoint of distributive justice that some individuals have more resources and opportunity, education and cognitive powers than others. Any inequality of resources or educational levels or personal cognitive ability above the threshold of sufficiency does not present a problem of justice as such.

Yet this commitment to sufficiency ultimately translates into a commitment to equality, Sher believes, through the following additional considerations. First, he proposes a robust conception of the sufficiency threshold that is defined in terms of each person's "upper limit" (p. 158). This is the limit beyond which no further "infusion" of resources and opportunities, education, and reasoning ability will contribute to a person's ability to live effectively (p. 163). For example, we can imagine that past a certain educational level (say a college education), any additional education one enjoys will have diminishing, if any, return on one's ability to live effectively. From this point on, an agent has the "leverage" that is maximally possible to accord her in order for her to live her own life effectively. At this upper limit, we are each maximally and therefore equally equipped to go on to shape and determine the course of our own lives. In other words, the sufficiency threshold also ensures that each in fact has an equal chance in living his or her life effectively.

Sher's forceful and novel criticisms of luck egalitarianism are alone worth the price of admission, and future discussion on this subject will need to contend with his arguments. However, for the remainder of this review, I will limit my comments to the equally innovative positive part of his book. I will briefly raise two questions, one concerning Sher's move from sufficiency to equality, and the other more directly addressing his notion of "living a life effectively".

As noted above, Sher believes that there is a sufficiency threshold past which no additional resources and opportunities, education, and better reasoning ability can detract from the equal chance of each to live his or her life effectively. But while it is plausible that there is some point beyond which additional education or greater reasoning ability ceases to make a significant difference to a person's ability to live effectively, it is harder to see why this would also be the case with resources and opportunities. It is not far fetched to think that the more resources one has, the better one is able to live a life of one's own design. Having extra resources allows one to pursue options not open to others, gives one the economic security that makes the taking on of risky ventures not irrational, and so on. If this is correct, then Sher's sufficiency does not merge with equality, for differences in resource holdings above the threshold of sufficiency can in fact result in differential personal abilities to live effectively.

Sher anticipates an objection along this line, and he counters that (past the threshold of sufficiency) it is part of living effectively to adjust one's expectations and life plans according to what one has (pp. 165-167). That is, even though I am able to pursue options that are not open to you because you lack the extra resources I enjoy, you are equally able as I to live effectively since you ought to form expectations different from mine in light of your lesser holdings. So relative to the expectations you ought to have, your ability to live effectively is equal to mine relative to the expectations I am entitled to form.

But does this response not get the reasoning backwards? Rather than developing a theory of distributive justice based on what people's adjusted expectations are, don't we first need a theory of distributive justice in order to determine people's legitimate expectations and entitlements? Even assuming that everyone is already at or above some threshold of sufficiency, is it fair for the less advantaged to adjust-down her life plans to fit her resource base, whereas the advantaged is free to pursue more ambitious plans? It would be fair if each has their legitimate share, but we can know this only if there is a theory of distribution operating in the background to tell us this. To insist that persons ought to form expectations in light of the options actually available to them seems to introduce the familiar problem of adaptive preferences.

Be that as it may, the above remarks at most severe the link between sufficiency and equality. Sher can still hold that distributive justice is about securing people's ability to live their own lives effectively. So long as all are reasonably able to live their own lives effectively, variations in their ability due to resource inequality is not unacceptable. That is, Sher may want to stand firm on his theory of sufficiency and not worry that it does not connect with equality. This, of course, will be only half of what Sher wants to argue for -- that distributive justice is committed to ensuring that each has a sufficient chance to live her own life effectively rather than an equal chance -- but it is a challenging and novel position as it is. Sher can maintain his perfectionism without his egalitarianism.

My second question more directly addresses the ideal of effective living. Sher fleshes out the requirement of living a life effectively from the perspective of the disadvantaged, arguing that (to recall) once some threshold is realized, living a life effectively does not require compensating persons for their misfortunes. To the contrary, success in living effectively requires that the unfortunate confront their condition and adjust their plans appropriately in light of the ever-shifting happenstance of life. But what follows if we, instead, look at the situation from the perspective of the advantaged or fortunate. What would living a life effectively require of those who are luckily advantaged?

Suppose that I have just won a footrace and am about to savor the sweet taste of success when I learned that my opponents raced with hampering injuries. Or suppose that my team won a match because the opposing side was, unluckily, at the receiving end of a series of bad referee calls. In neither will we consider the race or match well played or effectively won. Indeed, in the latter, we would think the victory was cheaply acquired. Or, finally, imagine that I managed to gain entry into a competitive and socially prized profession (say in medicine) but this was mainly because of a series of lucky breaks -- fortuitous social connections, good school options, fortunate familial resources, accident of social class, etc. -- that gave me advantages that elude most people. Is my professional achievement and satisfaction constitutive of a life that is being lived effectively?

The burden of living a life effectively, on Sher's analysis, seems to fall entirely on the unluckily disadvantaged in that they are expected to endure setbacks and respond with composure to their circumstances. But why should it be so one-sided? Shouldn't the ideal of success in living a life effectively hold certain expectations of the luckily advantaged as well? Wouldn't it require that they renounce some of their circumstantial advantages if they truly want to live a life effectively and do so with meaningful success? If so, we might want to modify Sher's argument: on the ideal of living a life effectively, the unluckily disadvantaged show flair, even class perhaps, in coping with their unfortunate circumstances with equanimity. But the luckily advantaged simply fail to live a life effectively if they exploit their lucky breaks, as if they were entitled to them, to gain the upper hand in whatever life's contests they are engaged in.1

Thus, if living a life effectively is also to be meaningful to the fortunate ones in society, then perhaps Sher's perfectionism slides back towards some version of luck egalitarianism: a society that does not annul good luck for its fortunate deprives them of the occasion to successfully live their lives effectively. To be sure, in keeping with Sher's ideal of personal excellence, one might object that a society guided by the luck egalitarian ideal would allow fewer opportunities for people to show aplomb by overcoming setbacks. But this seems a small price to absorb if it means securing for all -- advantaged and disadvantaged alike -- the opportunity to successfully live effective lives.

Sher will likely resist this extension of his ideal of living a life effectively. But then more has to be said as to why living a life effectively will require of the disadvantaged that they absorb the blows of misfortune whereas the advantaged may freely ride the winds of fortune. How would the latter be a case of successfully living a life effectively, just as how could you have played an excellent match if you happened to have the advantage of the referee on your side?

This is a stimulating and provocative work and I hope my brief summary and questions that it provokes does it sufficient justice. As the blurb on back of the book announces, this is at "once a magisterial overview of the field" of luck egalitarianism and "a deeply and original contribution". Anyone interested in luck egalitarianism and political philosophy in general will benefit from engaging with this elegantly and masterfully delivered book.

1 Compare here Ronald Dworkin's remarks that a person's life "goes worse when, even through no fault of his own, he lives in an unjust society, because then he cannot face the right challenge whether he is rich, with more than justice allows him to have, or poor, with less" (Sovereign Virtue, Harvard University Press, 2000, p. 265). This reference to Dworkin suggests that Dworkin's idea of the moral equality of persons is perhaps deeper than Sher thinks, and comes close to Sher's own starting point of "subjective agency". Like Sher, Dworkin is concerned with what makes for a life well lived. Thus it seems to me that the dispute between Sher and Dworkin turns on how each interprets that ideal. Compare Sher's ideal of living a life effectively with the two principles that undergird Dworkin's conception of dignity: "the principle of self respect" -- "Each person must take his own life seriously; he must accept that it is a matter of importance that his life be a successful performance rather than a wasted opportunity"; and "the principle of authenticity" -- "Each person has a special, personal responsibility for identifying what counts as success in his own life; he has a personal responsibility to create that life through a coherent narrative or style that he himself endorses" (Justice for Hedgehogs, Harvard University Press, 2011, pp. 203-04). Sher's criticism of Dworkin fruitfully invites interpretative debates on Dworkin's position.