Eriugena, Berkeley, and the Idealist Tradition

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Stephen Gersh and Dermot Moran (eds.), Eriugena, Berkeley, and the Idealist Tradition, University of Notre Dame Press, 2006, 320pp., $42.00 (pbk), ISBN 0268029695.

Reviewed by Dominic J. O'Meara, Université de Fribourg (Switzerland)


This volume includes fourteen papers presented at an international conference held in Dublin in March 2002. The papers survey (1) some aspects of idealism in modern philosophy, and (2), to a greater extent, a range of ancient and medieval thinkers manifesting, in various ways, aspects of idealism.

(1) The papers on modern idealism include two contributions on Berkeley. The first, by Bertil Belfrage, is a study of Berkeley's first book, An Essay Towards a New Theory of Vision (1709). The author draws a distinction between three 'autonomous fields of discourse' (204) in Berkeley -- the descriptive part of science, the theoretical part of science, and metaphysics -- approaching Berkeley's book as relating to the first field, as empirical psychology, thus allowing a better integration of the work with Berkeley's subsequent books relating to the other fields of discourse. The unification of Berkeley's thought will also be facilitated by the second essay on Berkeley, Timo Airaksinen's discussion of Berkeley's last work, Siris (1744). In exploring the images of the chain and the animal in Siris, Airaksinen (to read him is a rare intellectual pleasure!) shows how tar-water relates to God. However, the central work for Berkeley's idealism, The Principles of Human Knowledge (1710), is not examined in this volume. Idealism in Kant is discussed by Karl Ameriks, as it differs from that of Berkeley, to the extent that Berkeleyan idealism can affect the interpretation of Kant. In particular Ameriks criticizes in this regard the recent interpretation given by J. Van Cleve. Finally, the Idealism/Realism debate in classical German philosophy (starting in 1787, and focusing on Kant, Jacobi, Fichte and Hegel) is sketched by Walter Jaeschke, who concludes by making some philosophical points that are well-taken.

(2) The papers printed earlier in this volume (the majority) deal with ancient and medieval philosophers who may (or may not) be thought to anticipate idealistic themes in some respects. Dermot Moran reminds us in his paper of Myles Burnyeat's claim that idealism 'was not a possible philosophical option in pre-Cartesian antiquity', since philosophers then had an 'inbuilt assumption of realism' and did not know 'the problem of proving… the existence of an external world'  (126), a problem which first arose with Descartes and provoked idealism as a response. Not all of the papers in this part of the volume directly face Burnyeat's challenge, but they often discuss themes which are pertinent. The first three papers discuss Plato and early Platonism. Vasilis Politis argues for the presence of 'non-subjective idealism' in Plato, i.e. that for Plato 'the nature of reality… is derived from the nature of reason and knowledge' (19), on the basis in particular of a detailed analysis of Sophist 248e-249d. This challenging thesis I find not entirely convincing: the analysis of Plato's argument on p. 23 (e.g. P2) seems forced. Perhaps we can agree that divine reason produces whatever order and value appears in the world. John Dillon then discusses Paul Natorp's neo-Kantian interpretation (recently translated into English by Vasilis Politis and John Connolly) of Plato's Ideas as laws of thought having objective validity. Rather then comparing Natorp's views closely with Plato, Dillon suggests affinities with the thought of Antiochus which may have roots in Plato's Academy. Vittorio Hösle discusses in a more general sweep (without direct reference to idealism) three paradigms for interpreting Plato: the pre-modern approach to Plato, Schleiermacher's, and that of the Tübingen school (Krämer, Gaiser, Szelzák). The survey of Schleiermacher's hermeneutics in particular is useful, but I find puzzling Hösle's concluding words, which recommend taking Plato's metaphysics seriously, in connection, it seems, with 'Christian universalism in its modern variant' (76). Gretchen Reydam-Schils then brings us to the world of Roman Stoicism and offers a detailed and interesting discussion of the difference in Stoicism between divine thought, as constitutive of the world, and human thought. We then return to Platonism with Andrew Smith's paper on Plotinus, essentially a critique of E. Emilsson's reading of passages in the Enneads (in particular V,5,1 and I,1,7) as containing a realist theory of perception: Smith recommends reading these passages in context. In his contribution, Jean Pépin (a great French scholar who sadly died in 2005) provides a careful philological discussion of the conception of Ideas as the thoughts of God in Augustine's De ideis and in Augustine's sources, especially Cicero. With Dermot Moran's paper, we read the first of three papers on the 9th century Irish philosopher John Scotus Eriugena. In critical reaction to Burnyeat's claims (noted above), Moran argues for idealism in Eriugena by means of a very clear survey of Eriugena's system (creation as a process of God's self-knowledge), described as 'intellectualist immaterialism'. The next paper, by Stephen Gersh, examines the fourfold division of nature that structures Eriugena's exposition in the Periphyseon, with respect to its logical, arithmetical and idealistic aspects, in particular as regards the relation between numbers and ideas (Eriugena's idealism here means that 'production is thinking', 160). Finally, the case for idealism in Eriugena is argued by Agnieska Kijewska in her paper on Eriguena's allegorical interpretation of paradise, in which she concludes that for Eriugena 'the being of all things depends on man's intellect, and ultimately on God's all-embracing Wisdom'. Before coming to the papers on modern idealism (mentioned above, (1)), we read one final paper on the pre-modern period -- a welcome exception to the dominant greco-latin tradition -- by Peter Adamson, which concerns al-Kindi and the Arabic Liber de causis, roughly contemporary in Baghdad to Eriugena in France. Adamson argues (192) that the Liber de causis (an Arabic modified version of Proclus' Elements of Theology) is not idealist in that God is not an intellect; matter is not the product of thinking; and there is causation between sense-particulars ('horizontal causation'). I think the same could be said with reference to Proclus and Plotinus. But Adamson also says that the Liber de causis might be seen as idealist, if by this is meant the view that there are things caused by mind (198).

Adamson's conclusions bring out a difficulty already discussed by the editors of this volume in their Introduction: there are many forms of idealism in modern philosophy, forms which the editors list and distinguish. These forms may be related (at best) as a 'family' (as Moran suggests, 125), or perhaps (at worst) as merely sharing the same label in loose usage. Add to this the extraordinary richness of ancient and medieval philosophy, and it seems difficult to hope for any clear and precise answer to the question whether 'idealism' is unique to modern philosophy. But perhaps this is not in any case a very interesting project, of as little interest perhaps as the effort to compare strange fruits, brought back from a distant land, to the familiar produce in our local supermarket. What matters more may be the strangeness of these fruits, and this volume certainly exemplifies this to some extent. The volume is well produced (but why in such a volume must the reader be inflicted with endnotes, when footnotes are so much easier to use?) and includes a bibliography and indices.