Ernest Sosa and His Critics

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Greco, John (ed.), Ernest Sosa and His Critics, Blackwell, 2004, 331pp, $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 0631217991.

Reviewed by Jonathan L. Kvanvig, University of Missouri


Ernest Sosa is one of the most important epistemologists of the last half-century or so, developing and defending in various places his own version of virtue epistemology. This volume contains twenty-two critical discussions of Sosa’s views in metaphysics and epistemology, together with an introduction to Sosa’s epistemology by John Greco and replies by Sosa to his critics. In general terms, the philosophical quality of the essays is high, both that of the contributors and Sosa’s replies. What I find interesting in volumes such as this one is the degree to which the criticisms offered require emendation and expansion of the view under discussion. So here I will focus on what strike me as the high points of the volume, where Sosa either amends or expands on previous work to accommodate the critical points raised in the essays.

First, Sosa participates in a growing concern in contemporary epistemology for value issues. In response to Richard Foley’s argument that we ought to separate the theory of justification from the theory of knowledge, Sosa endorses a viewpoint becoming more common that there are a number of important epistemic concepts that deserve epistemological exploration, one of which is the kind of rationality Foley has clarified. Sosa thus does not defend his virtue-based approach by rejecting Foley’s account, but by arguing that there is something important about intellectual achievements that goes beyond Foley rationality, and requires a virtue-based approach.

In a relatively self-contained and notable section of his replies, Sosa extends the concepts deserving careful epistemological attention to include the concept of understanding, noting its connection with the concept of coherence and explanation,. This section is not addressed to any of his critics directly and involves an application of Sosa’s two-tiered theory of knowledge to the issue of what he terms “commitments.” Commitments, for Sosa, are those habits, dispositions, patterns of inference, and patterns of thinking that characterize a person’s intellectual approach to theoretical issues. Among the commitments of a person are the epistemic principles that govern the processes of belief formation and sustenance, and Sosa uses this self-standing section to address the question of the epistemic assessment of commitments.

As one might expect of a two-tiered theory of knowledge, the question of the unity and simplicity of the account appears throughout. One issue is the ancient Socratic worry about substituting a list of kinds of X for an account of X, and here Sosa attempts to explain what is distinctive about reflective knowledge in comparison to other sorts of knowledge that might be listed, such as perceptual knowledge, testimonial knowledge, knowledge from memory, inductive knowledge, etc. It is interesting to note that value issues are central to Sosa’s reply here as well. Sosa maintains that reflection has “properly a closer, and more finally determinative role” than other sources of belief and is thus more important than other types of knowledge, in addition to being important because of its role in agency and in skeptical arguments. The unity question also comes into play when some critics urge dropping one of the two tiers. Reliabilists will want to clarify reflective knowledge in reliabilist terms, and coherentists and other internalists will want to characterize animal knowledge, defined in terms of apt belief, in coherentist or internalist terms. Alvin Goldman pushes the first line, and Allen Habib and Keith Lehrer, together with Richard Fumerton, push most forcefully the second line. In response to Goldman, Sosa emphasizes the contribution reflective knowledge makes to understanding, and also the way in which the capacity to defend a view, central for internalists, is central to reflective knowledge. Sosa’s reply to Habib and Lehrer points out difficulties in the details, but also notes the way in which the notion of coherence in a system of beliefs that can be used to answer all objections to the belief is not wholly opposed to his own ideas.

In other places, Sosa continues and advances discussions that have begun elsewhere. For example, he and Keith DeRose have new things to say about Sosa’s complaint that contextualism is not a theory of knowledge at all, but only a theory of knowledge-attribution that cannot be extended in any straightforward way to provide a theory of knowledge. In addition, Sosa extends the discussion of the problem of the speckled hen in response to Fumerton’s interesting and probing argument that internalist motivations should lead to a version of foundationalism of the sort he defends, where the central notions are those of facts and direct acquaintance both with the fact and with the correspondence relation between that fact and one’s belief. This issue is pursued further in Richard Feldman’s essay as well. Feldman accuses Sosa’s argument against Fumerton of involving a false dichotomy, and in reply Sosa adjusts the argument to respond to the objection. The original objection involved a distinction between properties of a visual field and what one notices about what is in one’s visual field, and Feldman rightly distinguishes between focal and peripheral noticing in order to escape the problem of the speckled hen, claiming that phenomenal concepts are involved only with focal awareness. Sosa’s response depends on maintaining that someone could be just like us and yet have this phenomenal concept of seeing a 48-speckled hen, and thus be wholly unreliable in any judgment to that effect. There’s much more to say on this issue, but Sosa’s reply is characteristically penetrating.

Sosa also adds new material in response to two concerns raise by Stewart Cohen. One issue is Cohen’s problem of easy knowledge, to which, for the first time to my knowledge, Sosa provides his own solution. The second issue concerns the notion of safety and counterexamples to Sosa’s claim that safety preserves closure. The objection here involves Kripke’s red-fake/green-barn version of the fake-barn case first proposed by Carl Ginet. In the counterexample, your belief that there’s a green barn in the field is safe, but your belief that there’s a barn in the field is not safe. In response, Sosa proposes a new safety condition, including a requirement that the basis of the belief stay the same in the two beliefs. So if you deduce the second belief from the first, closure for safety is no longer threatened since the basis of the belief is different.

Solving one problem often raises another, and that is the case here. One doesn’t know that there is a barn in the field nor that there is a green barn in the field. Sosa offers further new material here, claiming that the lack of knowledge depends on a contingent fact about our phenomenology. In principle, there are two possibilities for perceptual states here: first, one might have a unified perceptual experience, one of being appeared to green-barn-ly (or “grarn-ly,” if you prefer); second, one might have two perceptual experiences, one of being appeared to green-ly and one of being appeared to barn-ly. Sosa claims that the second condition plagues human beings, and for that reason, we have to deduce the existence of a green barn from our perceptual beliefs that there is a barn in the field and that the thing in the field is green.

There is more to be said on this subject concerning how adequate an explanation we have here, but I won’t pursue that issue, since my central point is to highlight the ways in which this volume advances the discussion both in terms of new difficulties for Sosa’s views and new aspects of his view and new defenses of existing features of the view. The volume is an important contribution to current epistemology and to the development of, and our understanding of, Sosa’s epistemology.

One feature of the volume to note is also a feature of this review. The contributors write on Sosa’s views in epistemology and metaphysics, but the introduction and Sosa’s replies attend only to Sosa’s epistemology. The result is that six of the twenty-two essays are not part of the weave of the text. That is unfortunate, since a primary value in projects such as this one is to present the reader not only with a critical perspective on the philosopher’s work but also a response in terms of further explanation or emendation of the original viewpoint.

Even given this regrettable feature, however, the book is enormously successful. Anyone interested in developments in epistemology over the past fifty years cannot ignore Sosa’s work, and the discussions here make possible a fuller appreciation and understanding of Sosa’s achievements and place in recent epistemology.