Ernst Bloch and His Contemporaries: Locating Utopian Messianism

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Ivan Boldyrev, Ernst Bloch and His Contemporaries: Locating Utopian Messianism, Bloomsbury, 2014, 201pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472511768.

Reviewed by Eric Jacobson, University of Roehampton


Have the lights finally dimmed on one of the most imaginative German thinkers of the twentieth century? One finds few references today to Ernst Bloch (1885-1977) despite his remarkable ability to continuously rediscover a place for his thought within the myriad social and political cultures of the century: from Dada and expressionism in the first decade to the circles around Max Weber, Georg Simmel, and his fellowship with the young Hungarian Marxist Georg Lukács. His encounters with Walter Benjamin and the refugee intelligentsia in Swiss and later French exile are legendary. Bloch, a German Jew, makes his way to the US during the Holocaust, returning to East Germany in the late '40s to become something of a celebrated state philosopher, only to wind up again in exile (or homecoming) in the western Marxism of West Germany and the New Left. Bloch's work is just as grand: from a doctoral dissertation on the Neo-Kantian Heinrich Richter (1909) to a meandering study of the Spirit of Utopia (1918/1923), which appeared in two distinct editions, the first being predominantly concerned with opera. But this is not all. From Neo-Kantism, Marx and music, he turns to Thomas Münzer and eventually to an atheistic Christianity imbued with a large measure of Jewish messianism. The pursuit of utopia as a critical method finds a home ultimately in his most recognized work The Principle of Hope (1959), a revolutionary-romantic investigation in three volumes into the cultural wellsprings of the concept of freedom, the use of reason, and the idea of praxis as the unity of theory and action. Ernst Bloch seemed to have something to say about all the world-historical changes of the century. The only difficulty was understanding what he meant.

Ivan Boldyrev's study of Bloch in the context of his contemporaries is therefore welcome. Bloch's legacy is linked to the company he kept, and Boldyrev attempts to address this legacy in five chapters. Following a brief introduction that functions more as a preface on Bloch's relevance today, the first chapter introduces the figures and concepts that follow. Chapters two to five are dedicated to each figure: Lukács in chapter two, Buber and Rosenzweig in chapter three, Benjamin in chapter four and Adorno on the problem of postponement in chapter five. The book concludes with a brief defense of Bloch's utopianism.

Boldyrev's study bears the subtitle Locating Utopian Messianism, and chapter one makes reference to the temporality of the messianic idea. The author raises a logical problem of a utopian future that is always one step removed from the present. Bloch's utopian form of messianism is conceptualized as a Not-Yet-Being in a characteristic of his prose that is sometimes referred to as expressionism. The discussion of Bloch's style, which is also his method of reasoning, is limited considering the chapter's title, "Ernst Bloch's Philosophical Prose." It focuses instead on the role and function of utopia as a critical device.

Chapter two explores Bloch's relationship with the young Lukács. One commonality they shared is the use of the idea of tragedy, a trope one finds in a number of German Jewish figures from the period (cf. Jürgen Thaler Dramatische Seelen, 2003). The discussion of the theory of the novel and the problem of teleology and totality features in this chapter as well, the latter being important for the concept of messianism as a method. For Lukács, knowledge of the whole is obtainable by an understanding of its telos rather than the sum of its parts. This idea would resonate with Bloch, who viewed the teleological whole as a means to overcome the "pernicious chasm" of subject and object. (62) The chapter then turns more fragmentary with short excursuses on Hegel and Faust.

Chapter three is entitled "Eschatology and Messianism: Bloch with Buber, Landauer and Rosenzweig," and although all three are mentioned, the chapter is not an intellectual history. The references to Buber and Rosenzweig are brief, and Landauer receives less than a page. I came to understand the preposition "with" in the chapter title to mean that Bloch was similarly moved by Jewish messianism as the others. Yet each would have had a rather unique interpretation and use of the term. The author understandably places Bloch's messianism in a family of resemblances. By this, one assumes that any normative definition could only have been satisfied by the degree to which Bloch permitted a delineated understanding of his use of the term. Nevertheless, one is left to wonder whether the problem can be solved by context. A differentiation with regard to messianism between the figures is necessary if, for no other reason, to consider Bloch as a revolutionary subverter of the spirit of Christianity. The contrast between Buber and Rosenzweig on Christianity and messianism is substantial. The broad stroke of the brush cannot sufficiently address this. A comparison between Bloch and Rosenzweig in this regard would have been welcome. I could also imagine as relevant Landauer's distinction between Christenheit and Christentum. The chapter concludes with reference to Gershom Scholem's concept of the messianic idea in Judaism.

Chapter four is in many respects the heart of the book. If we understand Bloch's messianism as a future-oriented conception of the highest good in service of the present, a summum bonum that is always also a continuous Not-Yet-Being, he would undoubtedly share some commonality with Walter Benjamin. Benjamin's messianism is also a methodology toward the present based on a non-sequential conception of time. Things and concepts are related to each other in a cumulative but non-progressive fashion. But whereas Benjamin begins his messianic idea with a rather definite notion of rupture, he ends in the Theses on the Concept of History with a weak messianic tendency that suggests a historical link between the generations based on the anticipation of interpretation, which is present in every work and idea. There is perhaps for this reason an immanent tension between Bloch and Benjamin. Benjamin, as Rosenzweig before him, was acutely aware of the necessity of the ends and means resolving themselves within the messianic idea. The Messianic must be lodged somewhere solid, a place other than the merely referential character of metaphor, allegory or symbol. Otherwise the Messianic acts only as a pointer without substance of its own. Bloch saw the fulfillment of the messianic idea as constituting its own dissolution and therefore staked a claim in its postponement. Hence, for example, the notable chapter in his Spirit of Utopia (1918) that rejects Zionism's balkanized end in favor of the otherwise illuminating role of a people charged with bearing the torch of justice. For Bloch, the Not-Yet-Being can never truly end. The problem ensues however that without an end there is no beginning, presenting a bad infinity that undoubtedly shaped Maimonides's view of the problem of a practical or normative concept of messianism. Benjamin, for his part, placed emphasis on the handing down of an interpretive tradition, and thus the Messianic is first and foremost a philosophy of history, but also a concept of time that relied on the capacity of sudden rupture that breaks though the present, a "Jetztzeit" or Now-Time that is always here in the same sense that the work of art is always replete with a "hier und jetzt", a here and now.

Ernst Bloch and his Contemporaries, although entirely noble in its aims and objectives, is an unfinished project. Bloch is notoriously difficult to follow, and one is sympathetic to the author who registers his complaints on several occasions. The solution was to work thematically and revitalize the context of religious thought in Bloch, and thereby hope to inform his use and interpretation of Marx. Yet in seeking to contextualize with a broad brush, Boldyrev permits a few too many digressions at the expense of a more structured argument.

Another problem concerns the use of language. Boldyrev, a polymath who teaches both economics and German literature and philosophy in Moscow at the National Research University Higher School of Economics, would have presumably drafted the book in Russian. The English is fluid and admirable but nevertheless awkward in several passages. It was occasionally difficult to follow the arguments of secondary sources previously known to the reviewer as they were reproduced in this study. Between Russian, German and English, the tower of Babel and Benjamin's lamentation may have made themselves known. The responsibility for the quality of this continuous translation, which is part of the scholarly enterprise, must ultimately rest with the publisher. Bloomsbury, like other academic publishers today, would appear to invest too little in the literary skills and sound practices of editors. Instead investment is made in the marketing and promotion of multi-volume series to be sold to libraries and universities, and most likely in digital formats that are often bundled together with other titles in the same series. Here, too, Bloch would have had something to say about the power of capital in the new academic publishing enterprises where the author can sometimes be seen as the most expendable part. We are grateful to Ivan Boldyrev for redrawing our attention to the importance of Ernst Bloch.