Ernst Cassirer and the Autonomy of Language

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Gregory S. Moss, Ernst Cassirer and the Autonomy of Language, Lexington Books, 2015, 262pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739186220.

Reviewed by Samantha Matherne, University of California, Santa Cruz


In the past two decades, there has been something of a renaissance in the study of Ernst Cassirer. Thanks to the early work by John Michael Krois and more recent work by Michael Friedman, S. G. Lofts, Peter Gordon, among others, Cassirer's writings are again garnering attention from those interested in both his philosophy of mathematics and science and his philosophy of culture. Gregory Moss aims to make a further contribution to this trend by focusing our attention on Cassirer's philosophy of language. To this end, Moss endeavors to elucidate one of the central aspects of Cassirer's philosophy of language, viz., his commitment to the autonomy of language.

Moss's book includes sixteen chapters. In Chapter One, he argues for Cassirer's continued relevance in the philosophy of language and lays out his general approach in the book. In Chapters Two through Five, Moss discusses the historical (primarily Kantian and Hegelian) background that he takes to inform Cassirer's approach to language and culture. With Chapters Six and Eight through Twelve, Moss presents Cassirer's philosophy of culture and symbolic forms more generally. He uses Chapters Thirteen and Fourteen to explore Cassirer's philosophy of language and Chapter Seven to contrast Cassirer's approach to language with what Moss calls the 'mystical' approaches of Heidegger and Wittgenstein. Finally, in Chapters Fifteen and Sixteen, Moss discusses how language relates to the other symbolic forms of culture, like myth and science, and he offers a solution to what he identifies as a basic problem facing Cassirer's account of the autonomy of language and unity of culture.

Though Moss's ambitious book covers a great deal of territory, there are three major themes that emerge in his analysis: what it means for Cassirer to claim language is autonomous, the Kantian and Hegelian precedents for Cassirer's view, and the fundamental tension in Cassirer's account between his commitment to what Moss calls 'Horitonzalism' and 'Verticalism' about the symbolic forms of culture.

With regard to the first theme, Moss argues that Cassirer attributes three senses of autonomy to language: "independence, self-determination, and the form of free-signification that is constitutive of the a priori synthetic imagination" (14). Concerning independence, Moss says that for Cassirer, "language is autonomous in the sense that it is the form of culture upon which other forms depend. In this sense, it is independent, and the others depend upon it for their possibility" (10). Defending this claim is Moss's primary goal in Chapter Thirteen. In brief, he argues that because Cassirer treats language as the symbolic form that first enables us to represent objects, and the other symbolic forms depend upon our being able to represent objects, "language is a precondition for any other cultural-symbolic form" (199).

Moss furthermore suggests that Cassirer thinks language is autonomous because it is self-determining. For Moss, the relevant notion of self-determination is a Hegelian one, according to which transcendental consciousness (or the synthetic unity of apperception) is self-determining if instead of being determined by something outside of itself, it is something that determines and 'differentiates' itself: "Through a process of self-externalization and self-return, transcendental consciousness determines itself as the subject, object, and the unification of the subject and object" (88). According to Moss, Cassirer draws on this notion of self-determination not only to explain how culture as a whole unfolds, but also to clarify how language progresses. Making this argument about language, Moss claims that on Cassirer's view language is something that enables us to represent objects, subjects, and the unity between the two (218). However, he suggests that Cassirer believes this is something that only happens progressively as we shift away from more primitive languages that immerse us in the intuitive world of objects towards more advanced languages that enable us to grasp subjectivity "as pure activity" (223).

Finally, on Moss's interpretation, Cassirer understands language to be autonomous in the sense that it involves the free-signification of the a priori productive imagination. Moss argues that Cassirer draws on Kant's notion of the a priori productive imagination in order to explain how all the diverse forms of culture flow from one source. On Cassirer's view, Moss claims, the productive imagination engages in 'free-signification': its activities are "not limited to one logical possibility," but rather involve "free-variability" (179). Moss then argues that this imaginative free-signification manifests in Cassirer's account of language insofar as he claims that human beings are free to develop grammar and linguistic concepts in a myriad of ways and that this, in turn, enables us to vary how we represent the world of objects (204).

In addition to arguing that language is autonomous in the above three senses, Moss endeavors to show that Cassirer's philosophy of language is indebted to the influence of both Kant and Hegel. For Moss, it is particularly important to highlight the Hegelian themes in Cassirer's view because he thinks these tend to be overshadowed by a Neo-Kantian reading of Cassirer (vii). To remedy this one-sidedness, Moss maintains that Cassirer draws on both, using Hegel's notion of the 'concrete universal' to "complete Kant's Copernican revolution" (15). In Chapters Two through Four, Moss argues that Cassirer adopts Kant's transcendental method, i.e., the philosophical method that starts not with objects, but with knowledge and seeks to uncover the conditions of its possibility. However, Moss points out that Cassirer seeks to broaden Kant's project: instead of focusing just on the knowledge we have in mathematics and science, Cassirer aims to uncover the conditions of the possibility of culture as such. Hence Moss suggests that Cassirer's philosophy of language can be understood as part of his effort to broaden "the critique of reason to a critique of culture" (56, quoting PSFv1 80).

Yet Moss insists that we should not overlook the equally important Hegelian strains of thought in Cassirer's philosophy. As he attempts to show in Chapter Five, given what Cassirer regards as Kant's questionable commitment to the dualism between sensibility and understanding, matter and form, Cassirer was drawn towards Hegel's notion of the concrete universal as a way to articulate the sort of unity a symbolic form has as something that is both particular and universal. To this end, Moss argues that Cassirer takes over Hegel's idea that the unfolding of culture rests on the autonomous self-determination and differentiation of the synthetic unity of apperception. At the same time, Moss emphasizes that Cassirer rejects both Hegel's claim that the progress of culture should be measured exclusively by the standard of logic (8-9) and that there is a necessary way in which culture unfolds (12). With regard to the first claim, Moss maintains that Cassirer is committed to the idea that each symbolic form is autonomous in the sense that "we measure it by its own standards" (9). Meanwhile with regard to the second claim, Moss argues that given Cassirer's commitment to the free-signification of the imagination as the source of culture, he believes there is "contingency of the development" of the symbolic forms (96). On Moss's interpretation, it is only by appreciating how these Hegelian themes enable Cassirer to carry out his Kantian project that we will fully appreciate his philosophy of culture and language.

The third theme Moss pursues in this book concerns what he identifies as a tension in Cassirer's account between 'Horizontalism' and 'Verticalism'. On the one hand, Moss claims that Cassirer is a Horizontalist about culture insofar as he is committed to each symbolic form being autonomous, hence equal (243). On the other hand, Moss suggests that Cassirer is a Verticalist in the sense that he endorses a hierarchical and progressive view of culture, according to which the symbolic forms of myth and language are subsumed under and lead to science as the "highest achievement of human culture" (243). Moss proposes that these two commitments raise the following problem: if Cassirer endorses Horizontalism, then it becomes unclear how he can account for the unity of culture as a whole; however, if he endorses Verticalism, then it is no longer clear in what sense the forms are autonomous from one another (see viii, 11).

According to Moss, the solution to this problem turns on a proper appreciation of Cassirer's view of the teleological relationship between the various symbolic forms. By Moss's lights, Verticalism threatens the autonomy of each form only if one cashes it out in Hegelian terms, such that the relationship between the various symbolic forms is teleologically governed by "one absolute end" (251). However, Moss argues that Cassirer does not think that the unfolding of culture is guided by an absolute end; rather, the teleological story we offer of culture is a product of the philosophical explanation of culture: "only in philosophical cognition of the forms do the forms acquire an end" (251). Given that this end is a "contingent" one that is introduced "after the fact," Moss claims we need not worry that it infringes on the autonomy of the symbolic forms (251).

While there is much more that could be said by way of detail, in what remains I want to flag three concerns I have about Moss's book. The first issue pertains to Moss's method. In order to elucidate the role autonomy plays in Cassirer's philosophy of language, Moss adopts a sweeping strategy, which leads the reader not only through Cassirer's account of language and culture, but also through an interpretation of the basic philosophy of Kant and Hegel, the philosophy of language defended by Heidegger and Wittgenstein, and a discussion of contemporary linguistics. Though ambitious, readers may find it challenging (to use one of Cassirer's preferred metaphors) to find Ariadne's thread as they work their way through Moss's book. Admittedly, as those familiar with Cassirer's work are aware, Cassirer himself tends to adopt a comprehensive approach, presenting his own systematic views side by side with a careful analysis of the history of philosophy and empirical research in the natural and human sciences (Naturwissenschaften, Geisteswissenschaften). Moreover, Moss is upfront about the challenge his work poses readers, claiming that his book is to be read "rather like a crime novel, in which the culprit is not revealed until the end" so that "more is demanded of the reader, for she is forced to confront tough philosophical problems and struggle with them herself" (viii). Nevertheless, for readers interested in gaining a better understanding of what Cassirer has to say about the philosophy of language, it is not always clear how these other topics bear directly on Cassirer's own view.

For example, while one might have antecedently thought that Cassirer uses Hegel's notion of the concrete universal as a helpful way to gloss the reciprocal relationship between particularity and universality in the symbolic forms, in Chapter Five Moss attributes a robust Hegelian position to Cassirer, according to which Cassirer is committed to the idea that culture involves the dialectical unfolding of the synthetic unity of apperception in its self-determination and self-differentiation. Before accepting this position, the reader might like to be walked step by step through passages in which Cassirer explicitly commits himself to this view; however, Moss provides only a few quotes about Cassirer's commitment to the reciprocal relationship between subjects and objects and the idea that the particular contents of consciousness are defined in relation to the whole (83, 85).

To briefly mention another example, in Chapter Seven Moss discusses Heidegger's and Wittgenstein's accounts of language as two 'mystical' alternatives to Cassirer's approach to the autonomy of language. Although the comparison is suggestive, after analyzing Heidegger's and Wittgenstein's views at length, he devotes less than two pages to clarifying how this bears on Cassirer's own view (150). Again, the reader is left feeling unsure about how exactly to bring the discussion to bear on Cassirer's philosophy of language.

The second issue relates to Moss's claim that Cassirer thinks language is autonomous in the sense that it is an independent symbolic form upon which all other forms depend. I worry that by privileging language in this way Moss's approach does not do justice to another equally important aspect of Cassirer's view, viz., his account of myth. Indeed, it seems if one were looking for a symbolic form upon which all the others depend, Cassirer's text points towards myth, not language,

None of [the symbolic forms] arise initially as separate, independently recognizable forms, but every one of them must first be emancipated from the common matrix of myth . . . . Theoretical, practical and aesthetic consciousness, the world of language and of morality, the basic forms of the community and the state -- they are all originally tied up with mythico-religious conceptions. (Language and Myth 44)[1]

Cassirer accords myth such a primary role because he thinks that it is through myth that we first come to experience the world in 'expressive' terms, i.e., as a place that is animate and emotionally charged. This is what Cassirer calls 'expressive perception' and he asserts that it can "claim an independent right side by side with objective perception" because "it is that form of knowledge by which the reality not of natural objects but of other subjects is opened up to us" (PSFv3 79). Moss, however, tends to emphasize the deficiency of myth, arguing that "the form of signification in myth is not consistent with the form of symbolism proper" because myth is not yet "fully representational" (190). In so doing, Moss weakens the central role Cassirer takes myth and the expressive function to play in our experience of the world. Moreover, one wonders whether Moss has committed Cassirer to the position he criticizes in Hegel, viz., measuring the value of myth by the representational standard of language.

My third concern pertains to Moss's characterization of Cassirer's Verticalism and teleology. Although Moss suggests that Cassirer regards the end of culture as something that is introduced in philosophical reflection, he does not offer textual evidence in support of this idea, and it seems to be in tension with Cassirer's claims about the end of culture (251). For example, without any caveats about this being true only in philosophical analysis, in Essay on Man Cassirer says, "The highest, indeed the only, task of all these forms is to unite men" and in "Critical Idealism as a Philosophy of Culture" he claims, "The principal aim of all the forms of culture consists in the task of building up a common world of thought and feeling, a world of humanity" (EM 129, CIPC 72). What is more, given, as Moss emphasizes, that Cassirer uses the transcendental method to uncover the conditions of the possibility of symbolic forms, it would seem odd if he were to then identify an end of culture that is not something that makes it possible, but rather something that holds after the fact for the sake of philosophy.

While Moss is motivated to distance Cassirer's account from a teleology of culture in order to resolve the tension between Verticalism and Horizontalism, it seems that Cassirer can hold that culture as a whole has the end of uniting human beings and building up a common world, while still acknowledging that each symbolic form is able to do this in its own unique way. Though this is perhaps one way to resolve the tension in Cassirer's view, Moss's broad efforts to untangle this thorny issue remind us that this is a problem anyone interested in Cassirer's philosophy of language and culture must address.


I would like to thank Nico Orlandi for helpful feedback on an earlier draft of this review.


Cassirer, Ernst. 1944. An Essay on Man. New Haven: Yale University Press. [EM]

-- 1946. Language and Myth. transl. S. Langer. New York: Harper.

-- 1957. The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms. Vol. Three: The Phenomenology of Knowledge. transl. R. Manheim. New Haven: Yale University Press. [PSFv3]

-- 1979. "Critical Idealism as Philosophy of Culture." In Symbol, Myth, and Culture, ed. D. Verene. New Haven: Yale University Press: 64-91. [CIPC]

[1] See also Cassirer’s claim, "Myth is, therefore, to be regarded as a common background and a common basis for all the various energies that participate and cooperate in the construction of our human world" (CIPC 87).