Error: On Our Predicament When Things Go Wrong

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Nicholas Rescher, Error: On Our Predicament When Things Go Wrong, University of Pittsburgh Press, 2007, 120pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0822943271.

Reviewed by Frederick F. Schmitt, Indiana University


In this book, Nicholas Rescher treats the nature, causes, and consequences of error in all of its forms: cognitive error, or failures to attain correct beliefs; practical error, or failures to attain objectives; and axiological error, or mistakes in evaluation or judgment. Do these apparently disparate forms of error -- erroneous belief, action, and evaluation -- have something in common that would warrant treating them together? One answer would be that they all reduce to cognitive error: evaluative error is false belief, and practical error is false belief about the consequences of action. Another answer would be that all forms of error reduce to practical error: cognitive error occurs when the subject acts with the intention of producing a true or justified belief and ends up with a false or unjustified one.

Rescher's answer to the question of the many forms of error is closer to this second reduction. He says that all the forms have in common that "Error is a matter of getting things wrong" (p. 2). Error "involves a counterproductive act," either of omission or of commission (p. 2). This view becomes the second reductive view if involving a counterproductive act amounts to failing to achieve what the subject intends to achieve. But Rescher does not read "involves a counterproductive act" so strictly. He allows that cognitive errors can arise from counterproductive acts without failing to achieve the subject's intentions, as frequently happens in the case of acts of omission. These acts must be counterproductive in virtue of something other than the subject's intentions in acting. Rescher's notion of error will be regarded by some as too narrow. For it excludes computer malfunctions (as Rescher is aware, p. 3) and false human beliefs produced by passive automatic perceptual processing. It might also be criticized as unhelpfully diverse. Cognitive error, for example, includes both false beliefs formed with the intention of believing truths and unjustified beliefs formed with the intention of believing justified beliefs. One might wonder how useful it is to classify these under the same general heading of cognitive error. However this may be, Rescher focuses more on the differences between diverse sorts of errors than on their similarities.

In chapter 2, "The Dialectic of Ignorance and Error," Rescher distinguishes a true or adequate conception of a thing (one which gets all the important facts about the thing right) from a true belief about the thing. We can go wrong in our conception of a thing by omitting from the conception what is important about the object or by attributing a feature the object does not have. Rescher discusses the interesting question of how the inadequacy of our conception of an object affects our communication about it. He argues that we intend to communicate about the object as it is in itself, since we intend to communicate with others who have a conception of the object different from our own. He then argues that

we are never in a position to claim definitive finality for our conception of a thing… For to make this claim would, in effect, be to identify 'the thing itself' in terms of 'our own conception of it', an identification that would effectively remove the former item (the thing itself) from the stage of consideration as an independent entity in its own right by endowing our conception with decisively determinative force. (p. 29)

The result would be "a cognitive solipsism that would preclude reference to intersubjectively identifiable particulars… " (p. 29). But this last argument is unpersuasive. If I were to tell you that I have the definitive conception of the moon, that commits me at most to the claim that I couldn't be wrong about its features. It does not commit me to the claim that the reason I couldn't be wrong about its features is that these are simply whatever I believe they are (unless Rescher simply defines "definitive conception" as a conception that does not distinguish the object from the conception, in which case his conclusion would follow trivially from his definition). Each of these claims might be taken to entail that if the moon weren't (approximately) spherical, I wouldn't believe that it is. But the former claim is consistent with saying that the reason this counterfactual holds is that my beliefs are sensitive to the mind-independent features of the moon. Thus, the former claim does not entail cognitive solipsism. This vitiates Rescher's transcendental argument that communication presupposes that we have imperfect information in the sense that we could be wrong in the features we attribute to the object (p. 34).

In chapter 3, "Scepticism and the Risk of Error," Rescher argues for the "poverty of scepticism": the sceptic values avoiding error but not acquiring information (i.e., beliefs having a substantial amount of content, whether true or false), and this arbitrarily weights the value of cognition in favor of the avoidance of error. Here Rescher models our debate with the sceptic on a decision problem in which we have various options for action, the extreme ones being to avoid error by believing nothing, and to believe as much as we can without attention to truth and thus with a high risk of error. The options are points on a curve generated by two values, the value of avoiding false belief and that of acquiring information. Rescher rightly points out that the sceptic, so understood, assigns avoiding false belief a much higher value than acquiring information. Rescher makes an apt analogy: the sceptic is like one who insists that we avoid all automobile injuries by elaborate safety devices, at the cost of making cars as expensive and cumbersome as buses (p. 48). Against this sceptic, Rescher's point is telling.

Chapter 4, "Error and Oversimplification," contains a helpful discussion of the nature of oversimplification in science and its bearing on the complexity of science. Chapter 5, "Error and Morality," discusses moral error and its relation to cognitive error. By "moral error," Rescher means moral wrongdoing and wickedness (pp. 68, 76). It involves, in its most typical form, "a misjudgment that thinks a certain way of acting to be acceptable that just is not. It consists in being culpably obtuse (or even perverse) rather than merely mistaken" (p. 70). Presumably this is the typical form of moral wrongdoing, but not of wickedness, which would seem to involve something worse than culpable obtuseness or perversity -- namely, culpably embracing what the subject recognizes to be morally wrong and acting on this embrace. Rescher gives a compressed treatment of whether moral error is epistemic.

Rescher's discussion of the converse question, whether epistemic error is immoral, centers on the debate between W. K. Clifford and William James over the ethics of belief.[1] Clifford proposes that it is not only epistemically but morally "wrong always, everywhere, and for anyone, to believe anything upon insufficient evidence" (p. 74). However, Rescher seems to read Clifford as proposing something stronger: it is morally wrong to believe short of, not merely sufficient, but "conclusive, ironclad evidence" (p. 75). If this is Rescher's reading, he has perhaps been misled by William James's criticism of Clifford. James criticizes Clifford's proposal on the ground that it manifests an arbitrary preference for avoiding error over acquiring information. (James speaks of knowing the truth rather than acquiring information, but this misdescribes the relevant value, since we surely cannot know the truth by believing without sufficient evidence.) This criticism would be correct if Clifford insisted on conclusive evidence. But he clearly insists only on sufficient, not conclusive evidence. His insistence on sufficient evidence need not derive from a preference for avoiding error over acquiring information. For he could think that an insistence on sufficient evidence precisely honors an equal preference for avoiding error and acquiring information: to believe without sufficient evidence would manifest an arbitrary preference for acquiring information at the cost of acquiring false beliefs, just as to believe only on conclusive evidence would manifest an arbitrary preference for avoiding error at the cost of acquiring information.[2] When Rescher reads Clifford as proposing that it is wrong to believe without conclusive evidence, he makes the same mistake about Clifford as James does.

Rescher offers two objections to Clifford that do not depend on reading him as insisting on conclusive evidence but apply as well to his actual proposal that it is morally wrong to believe on insufficient evidence. First, Rescher quotes approvingly James's criticism that the proposal not to believe on insufficient evidence is a violation of rationality: "A rule of thinking which would absolutely prevent me from acknowledging certain kinds of truth, if those kinds of truth were really there, would be an irrational rule" (p. 75). I assume that Rescher would endorse James's treatment of the example James uses to support this criticism. According to James, when I judge whether you like me, I must believe that you do before I can acquire any evidence that you do, if there is to be any positive chance of your liking me; for my belief is causally necessary for your liking me. Since the end of your liking me is good, my belief is rationally "lawful" (i.e., permissible) even though I have no evidence for the proposition that you like me. Only "an insane logic" would make such a belief rationally impermissible. According to James, something similar holds for faith in God: I must believe that I stand in a relationship with God before I acquire any evidence, if there is to be any chance of my standing in a relationship with God. Apparently James maintains that in these cases, belief without evidence is not merely rationally, but also epistemically and morally, permissible.

I am not sure how far in this direction Rescher wishes to travel with James, since he does not make clear whether he follows James in analogizing faith in God to belief that one is liked by another. But even if we concede to James that my belief that you like me without evidence is rationally permissible, the point does not clearly apply to faith in God. My belief that you like me is rationally permissible only if I have good reason to think the following: that I must believe that you like me, not merely if there is to be any positive chance of your liking me, but also if there is to be a substantial chance of your liking me. For the value of your liking me is not infinite, nor that of avoiding error negligible, and so I should not believe that you like me under just any risk of error as to whether you like me. In the case of faith in God, unless the value of a relationship with God is infinite, or that of avoiding error negligible, I should not believe that I stand in a relationship with God under just any risk of error as to whether I stand in such a relationship. So my belief in God is rationally permissible only if I have good reason to think that there is a substantial chance that God exists. Yet it is not clear that I have good reason to think that there is a substantial chance that God exists. Perhaps I have good reason to assign some positive chance that God exists by reasoning that the existence of God has as much a priori probability as any point in a finite sample space. But this does not give me good reason to think that God has a high enough probability of existing to make it rationally permissible for me to believe that I stand in a relationship with God. James does insist that we are allowed to believe without sufficient evidence only when the proposition is a "live" option for us. But as far as I can tell, he intends the latter condition, that we are alive to a proposition, to be the merely psychological condition that considering the proposition moves the will. And this condition hardly entails that we have a good reason to think that there is a substantial chance that the proposition is true. James can defend faith without sufficient evidence only by showing that the evidence supports a substantial chance of truth.

Rescher's second objection to Clifford is that even if it is epistemically objectionable to believe without evidence, it does not follow that it is morally wrong to do so, rather than merely prudentially wrong (p. 75) or simply defective (p. 78). Now, James argues against Clifford that the pressing business of everyday life can make guessing morally permissible.[3] But Rescher has a different objection to Clifford in mind. The criticism is that moral wrongness is a violation of duty. Yet there is no duty to be a good believer: "in general people have no more a duty to be good believers than they have a duty to be good rememberers or good learners, however desirable it may be in the larger scheme of things for them to be so" (p. 78). Although Rescher offers no support for the latter claim, one might support it by a voluntarist requirement on the duty to conform our beliefs to the evidence: we have such a duty only if we have considerable control over conforming our beliefs to the evidence. Since we have no more control over this than we do over the quality of our memories or learning, we have no duty to be good believers. Whether this voluntarist requirement on duty is an adequate ground for the claim that we have no epistemic duty to be good believers has been thoroughly debated in recent epistemology.[4] Similar issues arise about a moral duty to be a good believer.

Rescher's second objection to Clifford's view finds some support from the following intuitively plausible voluntarist requirement for an epistemic or moral duty to be a good believer with respect to beliefs of a given class: the subject must be able, by reasonable efforts, to cultivate cognitive habits that bring it about that, for beliefs of that class, he or she generally avoids believing without sufficient evidence. This requirement arguably fails for some important classes of belief -- e.g., normal, automatically formed proprioceptive beliefs. These beliefs occur without any voluntary action or habit-formation and cannot be preempted or suspended. We are not able to cultivate habits to bring them into alignment with evidence.[5] Accordingly, we have no epistemic or moral duty to be good believers for these beliefs. (This is so, despite the fact that these beliefs have an epistemic status -- they are epistemically justified.) To this extent, we can support Rescher's criticism of Clifford's view. I note, however, that it is not obvious that the voluntarist requirement fails for any class of religious beliefs. Is it true of some people who undergo religious conversion that they would do so despite reasonable efforts to cultivate the relevant cognitive habits? It's hard to say, and for lots of reasons -- the play in "reasonable efforts" and "sufficient evidence" for starters. Of course, even if the answer is positive, this would show only that for this class of religious beliefs, we have no epistemic or moral duty to be good believers. As far as I can see, this piecemeal exclusion of duty is all that considerations of the involuntary nature of beliefs could establish. The exclusion does not imply that a voluntary leap of religious faith is not a violation of moral duty. So it makes no headway against Clifford's attack on the voluntarist faith supported by James.

In chapter 6, "Error and Metaphysics," Rescher brings to our attention and endorses an argument for realism proposed by Josiah Royce.[6] The argument is that if we believe that there is error, it follows that there is error (since our belief is either true or false, and in either case there is error). But if there is error, then our beliefs differ from reality -- hence realism holds. Rescher puts the argument too weakly when he expresses it this way:

If (as is indeed only too sensible) you are going to think that our cognitive situation is problematically disadvantaged -- not only open to ignorance or error but to some extent actually enmeshed in it -- then you will have to endorse factual realism as well. (p. 83)

We may see that this formulation of the argument is too weak by observing that Royce could directly infer that we ought to endorse realism from the bare psychological fact that we believe that there is error, since there being error entails realism. But Royce appeals as well to the premise that if we believe that there is error, it follows that there is error. So he must be up to more than simply showing that we ought to endorse realism in virtue of our belief that there is error. He is trying to establish, not merely that we ought to endorse realism, but that realism is true, given that we think that there is error. Royce's argument is sound, but it yields an awfully minimal version of realism. It yields only the view that there is a falsehood that is made false by something other than our believing it to be false. This is compatible with the view that for virtually all truths, the truths are made so by our believing them so, with the exception of the falsehood that some one of these truths is false, which is made false by our believing the other propositions true. So the realism established by Royce is compatible with the view that all the truths and falsehoods are made true or false by some beliefs or other. Has anyone ever wittingly denied this minimal a realism?

The last chapter, "Historical Background," touches on past philosophy of error. I don't know why Rescher omits the three major modern philosophers who devote the most effort to uncovering the forms and sources of cognitive error -- Bacon, Malebranche, and Hume.[7] Nor do I understand why Rescher devotes so little space to fallibilism (pp. 18-19), the view (inaugurated by Peirce and given purest expression by Popper[8]) that correcting false belief is the main burden of epistemically valuable cognition and that we achieve true belief, if at all, only as a consequence of correction. On fallibilism, it makes sense to address the correction of error as a topic in its own right, apart from the topic of acquiring true belief. Without giving fallibilism a hearing, we cannot know to what extent the business of avoiding error and that of acquiring true belief are entwined.

Rescher's book tackles important issues, however disparate they may be, and makes some valuable points. I remain unsure of the target audience for Rescher's book. It does not fill in enough background or define the issues sharply enough to serve as a good introduction to the topic of error for beginners in philosophy, and, apart from bringing to our attention Royce's forgotten discussion of error, it does not offer enough news or delve deeply enough into the issues to stimulate scholars. Perhaps its most useful service is to provoke the questions whether there can be a general account of error and what shape such an account would take.

[1] Clifford, "The Ethics of Belief," in The Ethics of Belief and Other Essays (Amherst, N. Y.: Prometheus Books, 1999); James, "The Will to Believe," in the Will to Believe and Other Essays in Popular Philosophy (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1979).

[2] My point here is roughly the same as one Allen Wood makes in his defense of Clifford (p. 16). I recommend Wood's discussion as an antidote to many common but confused objections to Clifford. See "W. K. Clifford and the Ethics of Belief" and "Clifford's Principle and Religious Faith," in Unsettling Obligations: Essays on Reason, Reality, and the Ethics of Belief (CSLI Publications, 2002, 1-88).

[3] However, as David Hollinger points out, Clifford does anticipate and defuse this objection by allowing us to act on probabilities without belief or guessing. See Hollinger, "James, Clifford, and the Scientific Conscience," in Ruth Anna Putnam, ed., The Cambridge Companion to William James (Cambridge University Press, 1997, 69-83).

[4] I have in mind the literature following William Alston's "The Deontological Conception of Justification," in Epistemic Justification: Essays in the Theory of Knowledge (Cornell University Press, 1989, 115-152). See also Richard Feldman, "Voluntary Belief and Epistemic Evaluation," in Matthias Steup, ed., Knowledge, Truth, and Duty (Oxford University Press, 2001, 77-92).

[5] In fact, we hold these beliefs on no evidence, and we cannot do otherwise than to hold them on no evidence. Yet they are intuitively justified. Thus, these beliefs are counterexamples to epistemological evidentialism -- the view that we are epistemically justified in a belief only if it is held on sufficient evidence (unless no evidence sometimes counts as sufficient evidence). These beliefs would similarly be counterexamples to a version of Clifford's view (that a belief is morally permissible only if it is held on sufficient evidence), if the status of moral permissibility applied to them. However, the beliefs are not counterexamples to a modified epistemological evidentialism: we are epistemically justified in a belief only if all evidence available to us indicates that it is true.

[6] The Religious Aspect of Philosophy: A Critique of the Basis of Conduct and Faith, 2nd edn., Methuen, 1930.

[7] Francis Bacon, The New Organon and Related Writings, ed. Fulton H. Anderson (Bobbs-Merrill, 1960), especially bk. I; Nicolas Malebranche, The Search after Truth, trans. Thomas M. Lennon and Paul J. Olscamp (Ohio State University Press, 1980), esp. bks. I and II; David Hume, A Treatise of Human Nature, ed. L. A. Selby-Bigge, 2nd edn. P. H. Nidditch (Clarendon Press, 1978), esp. bk. I, pt. 3, secs. 13 and 14, and pt. 4).

[8] C. S. Peirce, "The Fixation of Belief," in Nathan Houser and Christian Kloesel, eds., The Essential Peirce: Selected Philosophical Writings vol. 1 (Indiana University Press, 1992, 109-123); Karl Popper, The Logic of Scientific Discovery (Basic Books, 1959).