Errors of Reasoning: Naturalizing the Logic of Inference

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John Woods, Errors of Reasoning: Naturalizing the Logic of Inference, College Publications, 2013, 572pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781848901148.


Reviewed by Maurice A. Finocchiaro, University of Nevada, Las Vegas


This book will be of interest and value not only to logicians and epistemologists, but also to all philosophers, or at least those who practice philosophizing as a form of reasoning and argument. It accomplishes three things. It sketches a naturalized logic, which is meant to be the logical analogue of naturalized epistemology. It elaborates a theory of "third-way reasoning," i.e., reasoning that neither is, nor aims to be, nor is properly to be evaluated as either deductive, deductively valid, inductive, or inductively probable. Thirdly, it articulates an account of fallacies, i.e., argumentative practices like affirming the antecedent, hasty generalization, and ad hominem argument. The interconnection is that, because third-way reasoning is ubiquitous, a naturalized logic focuses on it, and this focus yields the following position: usually it is better (more economical) to correct errors of reasoning after they have been committed than to avoid them in the first place, and argumentative practices such as those just named are not really fallacious but rather cognitively virtuous.

This brief summary immediately conveys a sense of the book's novelty and originality. But this is not its only merit. It is also full of insightful methodological discussions that clarify and justify what John Woods is doing on such topics as the relationship of theory vs. data, normative principles vs. descriptive analyses, universal generalizations vs. generic generalizations, and conceptual adequacy vs. mathematical adequacy. Furthermore, Woods displays superior knowledge of mathematical logic, inductive logic, and artificial intelligence, and builds upon that. The book is well-argued, in the sense that Woods usually defends his theses with admirable skill, taking into account objections and counter-evidence, and examining the possible advantages of alternative positions. Finally, Woods's book represents a climax to a lifetime of distinguished accomplishments in logic and argumentation theory; this last point deserves a brief elaboration.

Part of the background to this book are works such as the following, whose titles and subtitles accurately describe their content: Paradox and Paraconsistency: Conflict Resolution in the Abstract Sciences and The Death of Argument: Fallacies in Agent-Based Reasoning. At an earlier stage of his career, Woods collaborated with Douglas Walton on such books as Argument: The Logic of the Fallacies and Fallacies: Selected Papers 1972-1982. More recently, Woods has collaborated with Dov Gabbay to co-edit some monumental reference collections that also include chapters with their own contributions, e.g.: Handbook of the Logic of Argument and Inference: The Turn toward the Practical (2002) and Logic: A History of Its Central Concepts (2012). Finally, the present book is part of the third volume of a multi-volume work co-authored by Woods and Gabbay and collectively entitled A Practical Logic of Cognitive Systems. The first two volumes, Agenda Relevance: A Study in Formal Pragmatics (2003) and The Reach of Abduction: Insight and Trial (2005), were jointly authored, with Woods writing the philosophical and conceptual parts and Gabbay the formal and mathematical parts. But due to a change of publisher and the excessive length of the earlier volumes, they decided to publish the third volume as two separate single-authored books; the present book is the first installment and is to be followed by Gabbay's Formalizing the Logic of Error.

As mentioned, Woods's naturalized logic is modeled on the naturalization of epistemology that has developed in the last half a century. However, Woods realizes (521) very well that such modeling is difficult and must be carried with a critical awareness of the differences between these two branches of philosophy. A key difference is that naturalized logic has much more formidable allies and/or competitors, i.e., mathematical logic and theoretical computer science, whereas naturalized epistemology has had to deal with the more manageable analytical epistemology based on intuitions. In any case, let us examine Woods's naturalistic approach.

Naturalized logic is "empirically sensitive," in the sense that it "should take note of, when they are available, the lawlike pronouncements of the relevant parts of descriptively adequate" (17) empirical sciences of cognition. Furthermore, naturalized logic is "practical, or practically minded," in the peculiar sense that it deals with the reasoning of individuals engaged in "small tasks," i.e., tasks that require relatively small amounts of "cognitive resources, such as information, time and computational capacity" (15). It is "agent-centered," or "psychologistic," insofar as it focuses on the behavior and characteristics of reasoners (12-13). It is "epistemically sensitive," inasmuch as

reasoning is implicated in much of our cognitive practice, conferring benefits on it when it is good, and afflicting it with error when it is bad, [and so] a logic of reasoning should attend to the constitution of the human knower. It must try to say what it is like to know things, and what it is like to be a knower of them. (83)

Naturalized logic is also "cognitive-economical," meaning that it is in a sense a branch of economics broadly conceived, the branch dealing with the production and distribution of knowledge. In Woods's own eloquent words:

An ecology is a dynamic system of interdependencies between organisms and their environments. An economy is an ecology for the production and distribution of wealth. A cognitive economy is an ecology for the production and distribution of knowledge. Economies of both kinds are subject to some quite general constraints. They define circumstances in whose absence the desired product is not produced or not as abundantly as producers would have wished. (184)

Such cognitive economy is probably the most significant aspect of Woods's naturalized logic.

Finally, there are two principles that help define the naturalistic approach. One is labeled the "convergence of the normal and the normative," which may be formulated as follows:

As a first pass, and when there aren't particular reasons to the contrary, how we do reason from premisses to conclusions is typically how we should reason. In other words, in matters of consequence-drawing there is a trending convergence between the normative and the normal, between what is usually done and what is rightly done. (52, italics omitted)

Note all the qualifications in this claim: first pass, typically, trending, usually. They are extremely important and seriously meant by Woods. Without them, this principle would be neither fruitful nor true.

The other principle is a fundamental epistemological claim, which Woods calls the "causal-response (CR) model" and formulates as follows:

A subject knows that α provided that [1] α is true, [2] he believes that α, [and 3] his belief was produced by belief-forming devices in good working order and functioning herein the way they are meant to, operating on good information and in the absence of environmental distraction or interference. (93)

To appreciate the importance, ramifications, and radical character of this thesis, it is useful to contrast it to the traditional account, which Woods labels the "command-and-control (CC) model," and which holds that

knowledge is a case-making achievement, in which knowing that α depends on the knower's constructing a successful argument for it, or at least having the argument ready to hand and within his timely reach. The ancient and enduring idea that knowledge is justified true belief (JTB) is a natural conceptual home for the case-making version of the CC-model. (97)

As mentioned, the primary subject matter of naturalized logic is "third-way reasoning," in the non-deductive, non-inductive sense specified above. This is reasoning that has been widely discussed under such labels and notions as nonmonotonic, defeasible, default, plausible, presumptive, and auto-epistemic. Good illustrations are provided by reasoning to and from generic generalizations and adverbial non-quantifications. Generics are generalizations formulated without either quantifiers or adverbs, e.g., dogs are four-legged animals. Adverbial non-quantifications are generalizations expressed by means of such qualifiers as normally, typically, usually, and characteristically, e.g., birds typically fly. It is important to distinguish both from universal generalizations. The latter are falsified by a single counter-instance, but the former are not; e.g., a dog with an amputated leg due to an accident does not falsify the generic claim about dogs, and non-flying penguins do not falsify the typicality claim about birds.

Woods advances three main theses about third-way reasoning. One is that it occurs mostly or usually "down below" (122), producing knowledge that is "dark" (124). He means that such reasoning is implicit, or as he clarifies further, "unconscious, sublinguistic, inattentive, involuntary, automatic, effortless, non-semantic, computationally luxuriant, parallel, and deep" (123). This thesis fits very well with the causal-response model. However, I am uncomfortable about this thesis, which I feel needs more clarification and substantiation.

A second thesis concerns the relationship between premises and conclusion in third-way reasoning, a relationship for which Woods sometimes uses the label "conclusionality." The point is that such a relationship is not a species of consequence. There is no way of tweaking the concept of consequence by starting with the paradigm of deductive consequence, modifying it in a manner analogous (but appropriately different) to what is done for probabilistic consequence, and arriving at anything that is still a case of consequence. In his own words, "consequence is the wrong paradigm" (242); this concept "makes no load-bearing contribution to the logic" (281) of third-way reasoning. Woods has a long and detailed argument (226-44, 255-81) supporting this thesis, and I find it entirely convincing.

Thirdly, Woods advances a similarly negative thesis about the relevance of the logic of argument to third-way reasoning. He is very clear and explicit about this: "do not model premiss-conclusion reasoning in the logic of argument" (132); "the modelling of premiss-conclusion reasoning as argument is the wrong way to go" (520). His support for this critical thesis is provided by the causal-response model. The critical argument here is simply the other side of the coin of the constructive positive argument for the model. The latter argument, in turn, is the whole work-in-progress of the naturalized logic proposed in this book. Now, although on the whole I find the naturalistic approach fruitful and plausible, I am not convinced about this particular anti-argumentational aspect.

With regard to errors of reasoning in general, and fallacies in particular, Woods's account takes the form of a comparison of the traditional concept of fallacy and the traditional list of alleged fallacies. The comparison enables him to elaborate a multifaceted and essentially convincing argument that there is a significant lack of correspondence ("misalignment") between the concept and the list.

Simplifying somewhat, the traditional concept has five distinct elements: a fallacy is said to be a (1) common (2) type of (3) reasoning that (4) appears to be correct but is (5) actually incorrect. These elements are meant to be individually necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for a cognitive practice to be a fallacy. The traditional list consists of the following eighteen cognitive practices, labeled by Woods the "Gang of Eighteen" (5), although he points out that the count of eighteen is not precise because some items can be either combined or further subdivided: affirming the consequent, denying the antecedent, hasty generalization, biased statistics, gambler's fallacy, post hoc ergo propter hoc, faulty analogy, ad baculum, ad hominem, ad populum, ad verecundiam, ad ignorantiam, ad misericordiam, begging the question and circularity, many questions, equivocation, composition and division, and straw man.

Woods justifies the misalignment thesis by arguing, basically, that almost all of these practices are not fallacious insofar as each fails to satisfy one or more of the defining conditions of fallacy. For example, in the actual world of human reasoning, instances of affirming the consequent are typically abbreviated versions of abductive arguments that have some degree of strength, or linguistic variants of biconditional arguments that are deductively valid (382-86). Hasty generalizations are extremely common in actual human reasoning, and so, by the principle of convergence of the normal and the normative, they are usually correct; and if and when and insofar as they are incorrect, it is more economical and efficient to commit the error and have it corrected afterwards than to try to avoid it altogether (212-16). Ad hominem attacks are often instances of pure slanging or meta-cognitive claims about issues like who has the burden of proof, and in such cases they are non-arguments and thus fail to satisfy the reasoning condition; on the other hand, when they are arguments, everybody understands that they are deductively invalid, but "there is not . . . a jot of evidence in the empirical record to suggest that . . . they are typically (or even frequently) drawn with deductive intent" (463).

Recapitulating, this book advances a naturalistic account of third-way reasoning and of errors of reasoning that is radically original, methodologically sophisticated, well-informed about mathematical logic and artificial intelligence, skillfully and judiciously argued, and maturely grounded on distinguished achievements. To these qualities, I can now add that the book is challengingly provocative, if I may be allowed to put a positive spin on some reservations and criticisms I have, such as the following.

One of Woods's most frequent method of argument is to tell an imaginary story about some fictional characters engaged in reasoning aimed to accomplish some epistemic or cognitive task, and then from that infer some generalization about reasoning, knowledge, or cognition. The longest such story (84-110) involves a team of extra-terrestrial creatures who visit the planet earth to observe the cognitive activities of humans; whereas the most frequent characters of such stories are named Harry and Sarah, who reappear every few pages to be the objects of our thinking. Now, it seems to me that this manner of proceeding is a version of the procedure followed by analytic philosophers when they attempt to reach conclusions about our concepts on the basis of constructing imaginary examples and then utilizing our intuitions to see what they reveal. However, Woods's naturalistic approach is supposed to be an alternative to the analytic-intuitive method, and his empirical orientation is supposed to exploit the law-like generalizations of the empirical sciences of cognition. So perhaps the approach he actually practices is more of a variant of the analytic-intuitive approach than he makes it sound in his reflective methodological pronouncements.

Additionally, with regard to the traditional concept of fallacy, Woods attributes to it a sixth condition in the definition; he calls it incorrigibility, meaning that the apparent correctness supposedly persists even after its actual incorrectness is demonstrated. I have omitted it in my simplified reconstruction for various reasons. Partly, I do not think it is really needed to justify the misalignment, because there is no cognitive practice whose fallaciousness depends only on the incorrigibility condition, in the sense that the practice satisfies all the other conditions but not this one. Moreover, I do not think there is any real trace of the incorrigibility condition in the historical sources that make up the tradition. For example, in Elements of Logic, Richard Whately (1826, 131) states that "by a Fallacy is commonly understood 'any unsound mode of arguing, which appears to demand our conviction, and to be decisive of the question in hand, when in fairness it is not'."