Persuasion, Reflection, Judgment: Ancillae Vitae

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Rodolphe Gasché, Persuasion, Reflection, Judgment: Ancillae Vitae, Indiana University Press, 2017, 258pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253025531.

Reviewed by Jill Frank, Cornell University


Rudolphe Gasché's goal  is to offer an account of what, referencing Hannah Arendt on Karl Jaspers, he calls a "thinkingly (lived) life" (2), a life or bios that is theoretikos cum politikos. Seeking to articulate the "'theoretical' dimension intrinsic to the practical, broadly speaking, to ordinary everyday life" (7), Gasché writes 'theoretical' in single quotes, here and elsewhere, to signal that he means not abstract, logical, or metaphysical reasoning but rather, as in the original Greek theorein, a kind of seeing or beholding bound with appearances. Calling persuasion, reflection, and judgment the "necessary" and "minimal building blocks" of a "philosophy that is at the service of worldly life," Gasché maintains that these modes of thinking are, nonetheless, "not necessary enough" to become "constitutive practices" of such a life. They are, rather, and in recognition of "their always precarious nature," ancillary (3). "Fundamental aids" (3), "maidservants" (1), or "handmaidens" (1), persuasion, reflection, and judgment "serve" (8) a philosophy that, unlike theory as it is usually understood, is "immanent to" a life "lived in a practical, ethical, and political manner" (3), while cultivating, developing, and refining "the thinking dimensions" (8) of worldly life.

 Gasché's ambitious, always insightful, and sometimes revisionist book is organized into three parts, one each on Aristotle, Heidegger, and Arendt, drawn from Gasché's seminars, lectures, and publications (vii-viii). Despite considerable differences among these thinkers, the book brings to light and takes as its focus an important thread they share:  that if thinking is to be political it must take its distance from scientific theorizing. Exploring political thinking via the activity of logos in Aristotle, Besinnung in Heidegger, and judgment in Arendt, this book is a major interpretative achievement that underscores what is at stake in political thought: in Gasché's illuminating readings, the "one question, one major concern" (1) which Aristotle, Heidegger, and Arendt all pursue in their respective approaches to political thinking as activity is the possibility "for human beings of having a world together" (202, 6-7).

If Aristotle, Heidegger, and Arendt share this concern, Gasché also maintains that each part of his book can "be read on its own," that the parts "do not explicitly build upon or derive from one another" (1). For example, although he sees good reasons to put Arendt on judgment in conversation with Aristotle on persuasive argumentation and Heidegger on theoria, Gasché leaves considerations of "the interface between [his] three investigations" largely to one side, explaining that the purpose of his study is "merely to point to a problem and to prepare the frame for its future elaboration" (6). Accordingly, in what follows I elucidate the specific contributions he sees Aristotle, Heidegger, and Arendt making to the thinking characteristic of the "fragile enterprise" (7) of bringing about and sustaining a political life. Because I worry, however, that the book's presentation of its parts as "independent" (4) risks occluding a key "problem" of worldly thinking, especially when, as for Gasché, following Arendt, world is "constituted by the in-between of human beings" (3), I open some interpretive questions about the relations among Aristotle, Heidegger, and Arendt, and also among logos, Besinnung, and judgment, before reconsidering the status of these activities in relation to a thinkingly lived worldly life.

Rightly insisting on the centrality of the Rhetoric to Aristotle's overall political philosophy, Gasché interprets this text, generatively in my view, through the lens of Heidegger's lecture courses preceding the publication of Being and Time (4), to offer logos as "a speaking-with-one-another" (11) oriented not to a rational truth reached through universal principles and deductive argumentation but to "truths that resemble truth" (5-6), which are "a function of public deliberation" (15, 23), whose elements are opinions, endoxa (19). Bringing to the fore the essential intersubjectivity of Aristotle's account of logos and the operations of the rhetorical situation subtending between speakers and hearers, Gasché maintains, again I think rightly, that while it is true that Aristotle focuses on "rhetoric's argumentative dimension" in terms of "proofs" (27ff) and "ultimate elements," stoikheia (49ff), "more than just reason is involved" (17-18) in Aristotle's approach to rhetorical argumentation. Explaining the enthymeme -- the centrally persuasive mode of argument to Aristotle -- as other than "a merely truncated syllogism" (27), Gasché explores the substantial care Aristotle takes to keep necessity as much as possible out of rhetorical argumentation. To Gasché, Aristotle's attention to the "fragile fabric of speaking with one another about issues of importance in everyday life -- issues that, by their very nature, are contingent and allow for opposite responses" (42) -- exemplifies how "speaking with one another is marked by precariousness" (43). And Aristotle's emphases on the contingencies of time and place, human plurality, plethos (147), and the bi-, if not multi-, laterality of speaking in and about the world, the ways in which a "rhetorical argument requires a judgment about its very plausibility by the audience, which participates, in this way, in the making of the argument itself" (33), underscore rhetoric's "concern with the possible" (45), as that is determined by both speakers and hearers, who, together and in this way, engage and sustain a political world by and in their speech.

Refusing interpretations that align Heidegger with the theoretical against the practical and/or political, Gasché reads Heidegger, focusing largely on his first Freiburg lectures and his essay "Science and Reflection," as opening the possibility of distinctively political thinking by unsettling "metaphysical, that is, philosophical, thought as we know it" (65), which is to say "epistemological and logical" (66) and modeled on "theoretical science" (67). Against the "representational, calculating, and measuring approach[es]" (68) of the theoretical sciences and their preoccupations with technique (121),  he  takes Heidegger to offer Besinnung, a kind of thinking that, Gasché explains, brings into view the "experientially privative attitude toward what is" that characterizes the "theoretical" in the mode of science (76), and orients to an "active way of thinking, or rather an action in the mode of thought" (105) that, eluding "the oppositional character of the practical and the theoretical" (5), allows phenomenology to gain access to the phenomena (88). As neither modern theory nor, Gasché insists, the theoria of Plato and Aristotle (103), Besinnung aligns rather with pre-philosophic theorein "as traveling to behold a foreign land" (5), a "watching over what is still to come" (104). Theorein, so understood, is "involved in making a however fragile contribution . . . to bringing about 'world,' that is, another world" (70, fn omitted). To Gasché, Aristotle and Heidegger differ in that Aristotelian logos is associated with "an already constituted public realm," whereas Heideggerian Besinnung, showing what it takes "to rethink the political, especially if the political is to be of the order of a world that takes shape only through and within political action" (7), actively realizes "'world' in a genuine sense" (71).

To be in relation to world in the mode of Heideggerian theorein is, in Arendt's terms, to judge politically, which is to say, aesthetically (179). Taking Arendt's originality to lie not in her commitment to Kant's transcendental philosophy, which, Gasché claims, "she [ultimately] entirely disregards," but to Kant's philosophical anthropology (208), Gasché explains, in language resonant with his discussion of Aristotle on rhetorical argumentation, that, for Arendt, judgment has nothing to do with "the subsumption of a particular under a given general concept" (179). Insofar as "there is judgment only where one confronts the particular without having in advance fixed concepts, standards, or rules" (189), "the ability to judge is linked to the ability to think, that is, to the destructive wind of thought, the quest for meaning or, more precisely, for a life of unrelenting critical vigilance" (177) "freed by the purging component of thinking" (178). Calling Arendt, alone among the three thinkers he discusses, a thinker not of philosophy but of political theory (171), Gasché sees Arendt's "recovery of the political" -- an "instituting of the world" (142) -- as both like and unlike Heidegger. If, to Gasché, Heidegger's primary concern is with the always "not-yet" (84) 'world,' which Gasché places in single quotation marks to signal its difference from actualized worlds, Arendt, by contrast, understands world not only as a potentiality -- to be instituted, preserved, and cared for -- but also as a "physical space" (151), the current "in-between of the public space" (141) as that "appears directly to our bodily senses" (138). Arendtian judging, also a practice of "political action," is "the happening of human freedom" (143) that, as itself an appearance "in the space of appearance that is the world" is "always particular" (181), what Gasché calls "a singular universal" (183).

There is much to learn from and admire in Gasché's recovery of Arendt's "rediscovery" (138, 165) of political thinking as/in the practice of reflective judgment, Heidegger's rethinking of thinking in the mode of political activity, and Aristotle's account of the logos of politics. And I have no argument with Gasché's decision to leave for "future elaboration" how Arendtian judgment might be illuminated by Heidegger on Besinnung and Aristotle's enthymeme (6). Still, as noted, I believe that this book would have benefited, interpretatively and politically, from putting its thinkers and their topics into conversation on other matters. For example, if, as Gasché claims, Arendt accepts Aristotle on political action "without reserve" (221), why not turn to Aristotle as well as to Kant to elucidate that action, especially when, in Gasché s analysis, Arendt on judgment turns out to look more like Aristotle on phronesis (191-95) than like Kant (200)? And if theorein, as Heidegger understands it, is, in Gasché's words, "the highest accomplishment of praxis (as in Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics)" (116, my emphasis), why not elaborate Aristotle on theoria? No book can do everything, of course, but in light of these specific interfaces on central themes of Persuasion, Reflection, Judgment, as well as the manifold appearances of other largely Aristotelian terms both in Gasché's analyses (e.g., doxa, peithein, prohairesis, dunamis, phusis, entelecheia, nous, etc.), as well as in the accounts of judgment and Besinnung in the primary texts of Arendt and Heidegger, a more explicit, sustained, and contextual engagement with Aristotle would have been helpful. Without such engagement, it is surprising to see Gasché accept without rejoinder Arendt's assessment (contra Heidegger) that Aristotle elevates the bios theoretikos over the world of politics governed by phronesis (194, which Arendt mistranslates as "insight," 191, problematically blurring the distinction between phronesis and nous), and/or Heidegger's claim that his theoria is "altogether novel," the "unthought concept" that "remained hidden to the Greeks," (70, also 69-71, 101-4, 107-10). What is the place of ancient Greek language and thought in the writings of Heidegger and Arendt and in Gasché's studies of those writings?

Insofar as Gasché's presentations of Heidegger and Arendt make plain the dependencies of their accounts of Besinnung and judgment on dialogue (108), words (110-111), and naming (111-112), there is also the question of the place of language itself, explored as logos in the Aristotle section, in the political thinking elucidated in the book's later sections. On Gasché's account, the essential relatedness to world of Heideggerian Besinnung is made manifest in and through speech (71, also 69, 87, 11). Similarly, for Arendt, for whom what matters is meaning not truth (175), and for whom the world of politics is a world of persuasion, peithein (156, 211) insofar as "persuasion is required for judgments themselves to be productive of community" even as persuasion "presupposes a political community of citizens and takes place in the public space" (211). Indeed, for Arendt, only "a judgment that meets the condition of communicability is in a position to demand others to agree with it" (209), and the "being-together" that makes up "the open space of the world, that is, the public and political realm," is a sociability that consists of communicating (215). If, as it appears, Heidegger and Arendt also, along with Aristotle, take logos to be a condition of the possibility of world (119), then treating the book's three parts as independent of one another means not putting these thinkers into conversation about the primordiality they all give to speech and/or language. This feels like a missed opportunity.

For all three thinkers, words make worlds, as Gasché explains and also exemplifies when, though he includes "persuasion" in his book's title, he largely refuses to use that word when discussing Aristotle, choosing rather to write about "rhetoric," claiming that, for Aristotle, "the art of speech does not consist in inducing persuasion but in providing its audience with ways to make up its mind" (24). Similarly, in the case of "reflection" which, while it, too, appears in the title, is, for the most part, discarded in the part of the book devoted to Heidegger because Gasché, following Heidegger, takes the Latinate "reflection," with its "dependency on subjectivity and consciousness," to be an inadequate translation of Besinnung (130). Leaving to one side here the content and force of Gasché's distinction between persuading and providing ways to make up one's mind, and the relations among Latin, German, Greek, and English, these examples suggest that for Gasché, as for Aristotle, Heidegger, and Arendt, words, in Heidegger's usage, "world." This is why Heidegger calls language "the house of being" and why, too, Arendt, following Aristotle, understands speech as that which makes a being political, a zoon politikon.

By way of generous and sensitive readings, Persuasion, Reflection, Judgment depicts, while not, however, quite performing, how, for Arendt, Heidegger, and Aristotle, political thinking is building, preserving, and caring for worlds that we create and sustain discursively. Insofar as for all three thinkers, wordlessness is a kind of worldlessness, their shared concern about the possibility "for human beings of having a world together" critically depends on speech. Indeed, as Arendt insists, following Aristotle, only where there is speech in the mode of persuasion can the muteness of violence be avoided (212). It is because speech makes and sustains political worlds, that such worlds are fragile. Seen in this way, political thinking as/in discursive activity, whether in the mode of persuasion, reflection, or judgment, is not "in the service" of a philosophy adequate to world. Nor is it "ancillary" to a thinkingly lived life. Rather, political thinking as/in discursive activity is "necessary enough to become constitutive," not least because, if we aim to avoid violence when it comes to potentializing and actualizing our precarious political worlds, intermediating logos is all we have.