Essays in Ancient Epistemology

Essays In Ancient Epistemology

Gail Fine, Essays in Ancient Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2021, 417pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198746768.

Reviewed by Lloyd P. Gerson, University of Toronto


The present volume collects 13 previously published papers in ancient epistemology, written over the last 20 years or so. Seven of the papers are on Plato’s dialogues, two are on Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics, and four are mainly on Sextus Empiricus and Pyrrhonian Skepticism, including some pages on the Cyrenaics and Descartes in relation to the Skeptics.

All of the essays in this book exemplify the author’s well-known approach to ancient epistemology generally, which is to attempt to commensurate the ancient and the modern. Gail Fine reads Plato and his successors as contributors to an ongoing discussion which continues up to the present. In epistemology, this is a discussion regarding, among other things, what knowledge is, what things are knowable, how knowledge differs from belief, what justification is, and so on. One of the principal impediments to commensuration is that the semantic range of the cognitive vocabulary in ancient Greek does not, in many subtle ways, match up with the contemporary analogue. The ancient Greek word epistēmē is not quite equivalent to the word “knowledge” as that is generally used among English-speaking analytic philosophers. The main reason for this is that Plato, and virtually everyone else Fine discusses in this book, took epistēmē to be something like a natural kind term, similar to “digestion” or “parturition.” Thus, asking the question “what is epistēmē ?” is asking a question for which there is a right answer and many wrong answers. Accordingly, whatever answer is given to this question will reflect directly on related terms like “belief,” “justification,” “truth,” and so on.

There is some irony in the fact that, as Roderick Chisholm noted long ago, the crucial link between ancient and contemporary accounts of knowledge is the idea of criteria of knowing, and it is to the skeptics, particularly the Academic skeptics, that we owe this approach. But criteriology is subtly different as practiced among the Academic skeptics and among those whose focus in epistemology is on the so-called Standard Analysis of knowledge as justified true belief. For the ancient skeptics agreed that epistēmē is a natural kind term. The nub of their powerful critique of all forms of dogmatism, including Plato’s, Aristotle’s, and the Stoics’, was that once we understand the criteria for knowing, we can see that knowledge is not possible for humans. And as Sextus Empiricus shrewdly notes, since the dogmatists all think that the wisdom they seek is a form of knowledge, if knowledge is impossible, then we can explode all of their pretensions. If, however, the quest for criteria of knowing is not like a quest for symptoms indicating the presence of a virus or some disease, that is, the presence of a natural kind, then criteria for knowledge become something different. I would locate the beginning of the subtle shift from seeking criteria of a natural kind to criteria for stipulative use to the subordination of philosophy to the new physics in the 17th century. Philosophers sought to articulate what should count as knowledge on the assumption that what counts is what is taken to be empirically adequate. Once knowledge was no longer taken to be a natural kind, considerations other than those that, for the ancients, linked knowledge and wisdom, came to the fore. These included political considerations. Richard Rorty was right to insist that, if knowledge is not a natural kind, the entire enterprise of epistemology can have, at best, a pragmatic social function. What counts as knowledge is what manages to meet the criteria of enlightened political adequacy.

The tension that arises from, on the one hand, assuming that the ancient philosophers take epistēmē as a natural kind term and, on the other, trying to commensurate their conclusions with those who do not is evident at various places in this book. Fine is a meticulous reader of Plato and others with a highly refined analytic eye. She seems to me often to arrive at a convincing exposition of the arguments, often with the implicit proviso that the texts are underdetermined with regard to the answers to questions that high-powered analysis raises. There are a lot of “perhaps he means this” and “perhaps he means that” in this book, and rightly so. At the same time, Fine’s commitment to commensurability leads her to assume that Plato and Aristotle structure their own epistemological analyses along familiar contemporary lines. For example, Fine assumes that epistēmē is primarily, if not exclusively, propositional, that is, that propositions are the objects of knowledge and belief. I believe this assumption is anachronistic. The imputation of anachronism is not met by pointing out that Plato has a general idea of what a proposition is and what semantic truth value is, and that the latter attaches to the former. In response to the question, “what is knowledge?” it is obviously of no help whatsoever to reply, “knowledge is of propositions,” an answer that is no more illuminating than to say, in response to the question “what is digestion?” that digestion is of food. In fact, for Plato epistēmē is a state (pathos) of the soul in which the knowable is somehow present and the knower is aware of that presence. A knower may express or represent that state to others or to himself, but epistēmē is not of the representing proposition. If it were, it would be a deep mystery why epistēmē does not spread like wildfire throughout the world. If, however, epistēmē is not propositional, the commensuration, which assumes that Plato intends something like the Standard Analysis is not easily achieved, if it is at all. For one thing, the justification sought for justified true belief will be found in some other proposition, though Fine is, I think, unable to provide even one example of a proposition adduced by Plato as justification for another proposition.

An analogous consideration pertains to Fine’s definition of belief (doxa) as “taking something to be true.” “True” here is a semantic property of propositions, in which case “something” refers to a proposition. The “taking” here is presumably a synonym for “belief,” in which case, her definition is unhelpful. More importantly, doxa, like epistēmē, is a pathos or state of the soul. It is primarily passive, not active, as the use of “taking” would suggest. The term introduced by the Stoics, sunkatathesis (“assent”), better reflects Fine’s understanding of doxa in ancient contexts. Consequently, the correct initial question is: what is it that causes belief in us? The answer in ancient philosophy is usually sense-perception. If this is true, then there is a problem with maintaining that there can be doxa of intelligibles and epistēmē of sensibles. At least it is a problem that needs to be addressed before commensuration is attempted. For example, Forms are not propositions, and if doxa is of propositions, then it would seem to follow that there can be no doxa regarding Forms except in some attenuated sense. Fine acknowledges the generally held view in antiquity that epistēmē is cognitively superior to belief—even true belief. It is the ne plus ultra of cognition. But this is a superiority rooted in metaphysics, not politics, because epistēmē and doxa are natural kinds. It would perhaps be clearer, then, to talk about these two kinds rather than “the concepts” of knowledge and belief, where these concepts are fungible and easily subordinated to considerations other than epistemological.

The first essay (Ch. 2) in the book is a good example of Fine’ attunement to the semantic differences between ancient Greek and contemporary English cognitive vocabulary. She argues in considerable detail that when Socrates in the Apology seems to suggest that he knows that he knows nothing, he is not contradicting himself. Rather, paying close attention to the complex cognitive vocabulary used, he is most likely claiming something like this: “I am aware that I do not possess the high-level of knowledge that is, rightly, identified with wisdom.” I am not sure how Fine understands “high-level” and low-level” knowledge, but her using this distinction to make her case is a good example of her subtle efforts at commensuration. High-level and low-level knowledge makes sense within a contemporary setting (e.g., low level: “I know but I may be mistaken”), but I doubt it makes sense within a Platonic framework, even in the early dialogue Apology.

The second essay (Ch. 3) is an exercise in uncompromising commensuration. Fine argues that in the Meno, Plato claims that epistēmē is true belief plus something, namely, an aitias logismos, roughly, an account of the explanation for why a proposition is true. In other words, Plato here discovers the bones of the Standard Analysis. This accounting involves relating the proposition known to other propositions (“their justification”) in the field or domain. Fine runs into trouble in applying her analysis to the example of the road to Larissa, which, as Socrates says, can be the object of knowledge or of a true belief. Fine is committed to saying that the former differs from the latter according to an account of why it is true that this is the road to Larissa. But in order to make it plausible that the explanation is a proposition related to another proposition, that which is known, Fine changes “the road to Larissa” into “the best road to Larissa.” Apart from the fact that in the latter part of the 4th century B.C.E. there was probably only one road from Athens to Larissa, it seems fairly clear that what differentiates knowledge from belief here is that the knower is acquainted with the road, whereas the believer has only heard of it second-hand. As Socrates says, for practical purposes this is good enough, but it is not stable in the way that knowledge is. The main point, though, is that without the justificatory condition, the attempt to attach Plato to a justified-true-belief model of knowledge is derailed, not only for the above reason but also because, contrary to Fine’s insistence, knowledge will not be a species of belief. It would be the case that the proposition “this is the road to Larissa” is truly believed; but to say that the same proposition is known, is to elide the pathos of epistēmē with the proposition that the knower might use to express that state. That the knower can express her knowledge in a proposition that can also be believed does not make epistēmē a species of belief. If knowledge is propositional, then it would indeed be odd to deny that knowledge and belief are propositional attitudes possibly relating to the identical proposition. But if this is not the case, then the reason for making knowledge a species of belief disappears.

The next three papers (Chs. 4, 5, and 6) are all concerned with the Phaedo and the account of epistēmē Fine finds there. She maintains that, while the doctrine of recollection assumes that there is epistēmē of Forms known by us in our pre-incarnate state, there can also be epistēmē of sensibles. There are in fact two levels of wisdom, the sort of knowledge that philosophers seek: the first is of Forms and the second is applied to sensibles on the basis of Forms. Wisdom, Fine insists, is not restricted to Forms. I think it is indisputable that for Plato the whole point of seeking knowledge of Forms is to apply it here below. But the claim that the application amounts to knowledge, too, and not just true belief not only ignores the way that Plato differentiates knowledge and belief by their objects in the Republic and the Timaeus, but also, as Fine seems to admit, compromises her earlier insistence that the justificatory condition of the Standard Analysis is crucial to differentiating knowledge and true belief. It is certainly true that Socrates in the Phaedo says that a Form is the aitia (“explanation”) for a true predicative judgment; Helen is beautiful because she partakes of beauty. But it does not follow from this that knowledge of the Form of Beauty entails knowledge of Helen’s beauty except in a loose sense of “knowledge” which does not fit well with knowledge as a natural kind. If I know the Form of Beauty, then of course I will be better able to identify beautiful things here below. But it does not follow from this that I have knowledge of instances of Beauty rather than true belief.

It should be added that there is probably a close connection between the case of the one who knows the road to Larissa and the one who only believes it truly, on the one hand, and the case in the Theaetetus, on the other, of the eyewitness who knows who committed the crime and the jury who only believes this truly. The Theaetetus example does not show that the eyewitness has knowledge; it only shows that the jury does not, since there is something better than hearsay evidence. The eyewitness “knows” by sense-perception, which has already been shown earlier in the dialogue not to be knowledge. Fine argues that epistēmē, since it can be had of propositions concerning the sensible world, is quite common. If so, then the justificatory condition, which is somewhat elusive in her exposition, will be open to the identical skeptical challenges that Sextus visits upon the Stoics. It is worth pointing out, however, that Sextus never argues against Plato—as he does against the Stoics—as if Plato is committed to a justificatory condition for empirical knowledge.

I found Chapter 6 the most puzzling. For, here, Fine argues that Plato does indeed hold that we have knowledge prior to incarnation, but that we do not possess innate knowledge after birth. I confess that I do not follow this argument, since it seems clear that the recollection argument in the Phaedo depends on our having innate knowledge now which we apply as a criterion for discerning the ontological inferiority of instances of Forms to the Forms themselves. Fine seems to think that this cannot be knowledge since knowledge requires the ability to give an account. But, as we have seen, the ability to give an account is an expression or manifestation of knowledge and it is perfectly possible to “possess” knowledge without “having” it at hand and so, to know without being able to give an account now, that is, without having recollected, as the Theaetetus explains.

The two papers on Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics (Chs. 9 and 10) deal with material that is in principle more hospitable to commensuration than are the dialogues of Plato. For one thing, Aristotle introduces a new term, hupolēpsis, that is a genus that includes epistēmē and doxa. This would seem to encourage the view according to which there can be epistēmē and doxa of the same things. And yet Aristotle, as Fine recognizes, insists that the former is of what is universal and cannot be otherwise, whereas the latter is of the contingent or what can be otherwise. This fact leads Fine to argue that whereas Plato does not hold a “two-world” metaphysics, Aristotle does. Aristotle, Fine says, has a more demanding conception of knowledge than Plato does. I find this implausible. So, too, does Aristotle. Plato in the Republic makes epistēmē depend ultimately on a cognitive encounter with the superordinate Idea of the Good, which Aristotle rejects. Nevertheless, limiting epistēmē to that which is necessary and universal is along Platonic lines. I am not sure why Fine thinks that Plato’s conception of knowledge is more rigorous than Aristotle’s since Plato, according to Fine, thinks that there is epistēmē of the sensible world, whereas Aristotle does not. I find puzzling, too, Fine’s claim that Aristotle, like Plato, requires explanation for epistēmē, but that he thinks that epistēmē does not exhaust the scope of knowledge. Of course, as we saw above, Aristotle does recognize a sense in which we can say that we have knowledge of sensibles. In addition, he recognizes incidental knowledge, when an explanation for the fact that something is the case is missing. Aristotle calls this “sophistical” knowledge. As far as I can see, these qualifications only emphasize the fact that epistēmē is a natural kind and that there is nothing literally like it that is not it, just as there is nothing like digestion which is not digestion, even if we can metaphorically digest a good book.

I am not persuaded of Fine’s contention in Chapter 10 that, whereas Plato adheres only to de dicto necessity in his account of knowledge, Aristotle insist on de re necessity. According to Fine, Plato only believes that necessarily, if one knows that p, then p, whereas it is not necessarily the case that if one knows that p, then necessarily p. By contrast, Aristotle believes that if one knows p, then necessarily p. I do not know how this comports with Plato’s supposedly more rigorous account of knowledge. Plato does say, in the Republic, that epistēmē is of the really real, that is, of what cannot be otherwise. I take it that this is Plato’s mature view, more or less followed by Aristotle. To say that Aristotle’s view amounts to a “two-world” metaphysics seems unobjectionable but only if one takes the word “world” in the widely-used sense in which we speak of the dance “world” or the sports “world.” In that case, I do not follow Fine’s argument that Plato rejects a “two-world” theory, whereas Aristotle embraces it. But this “two-world” theory is not about propositions; it is about two worlds, two realms of being.

The section devoted to the skepticism of Sextus Empiricus (Chs. 11–14) is largely focused on two claims: first, that the Pyrrhonian Sextus Empiricus did not renounce beliefs entirely; rather, he maintained that he did have beliefs about his own internal states; second, that Sextus did maintain an extreme external world skepticism, something at least as radical as that postulated by Descartes in the first Meditation. The claim that Sextus was committed to certain beliefs, those relating to his internal states (“it seems to me that the honey tastes sweet”) has a foundation in his Outline of Pyhrrhonism. The dogmatist is not without resources in attacking Sextus’s very limited commitment to belief. Some have, however, been reluctant to count this as belief mainly because it would open Sextus to the same objection that Socrates brings against Protagoras’s relativism in the Theaetetus. If belief is, as Fine says, “taking to be true,” then if Sextus has any belief, he takes the proposition expressing that belief to be true. In that case, it is objectively true for anyone else that Sextus takes that proposition to be true. And that concession seems to cut against his external world skepticism. For the external world of anyone but Sextus will include truths held by Sextus. If, Sextus replies that he does not maintain that his beliefs are true—that, in effect, there is a distinction between veridical and non-veridical appearances, and he makes no claim regarding the former—there may not be much difference between holding that his beliefs are non-veridical and holding that he has no beliefs at all. Fine may be right that one cannot have a belief without taking it to be true, but perhaps she is mistaken in supposing that doxa just means belief.

Fine enlarges her focus by adducing the Cyrenaics as predecessors to Sextus in maintaining that there are truths, beliefs, and knowledge about subjective states. She makes an illuminating foray into Descartes’ Meditations to show that he is in fact not the first philosopher to discover the subjective realm of truth. No doubt, the Cyrenaics held that we have some sort of cognitive relation to our subjective states, but I don’t think there is evidence that they would describe that as epistēmē.

I have not had the space to mention the paper on sense-perception in the Theaetetus and the Phaedo (Ch. 7), and the paper on the pseudo-Platonic Sisyphus and its interesting analogue to the paradox of learning in Meno (Ch. 8). All of the papers are in fact well worth studying for their rigorous analysis and their challenges to various orthodoxies. I especially deeply appreciate Fine’s efforts at commensurability as much as I would question some of her results.