Essays in Moral Skepticism

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Richard Joyce, Essays in Moral Skepticism, Oxford University Press, 2016, 274pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198754879.

Reviewed by Jack Woods, University of Leeds


Richard Joyce is best known for his articulation and defense of the moral error theory, for his particular brand of moral fictionalism, and for his part (along with Sharon Street) in popularizing evolution-based debunking arguments against various moral realisms. This book is proof that these achievements unite into a compelling take on moral thought, talk, and the justification thereof. The collection is divided into three parts, corresponding roughly to these three claims to fame, though the essays often cross these section divisions. The two new contributions are an essay revisiting evolutionary debunking arguments in the light of recent developments and a useful summary introduction to the three themes of the book. Even though eleven of the twelve essays are reprinted, collection in one volume is useful given how much of it was previously published in other volumes and special collections.

The first section, on moral error theory, illustrates the usefulness of collecting this work together. Chapter 1, "Expressivism, Motivational Internalism, and Hume," lays out the relationship between Joyce's error-theory and non-cognitivism. Roughly, his view is that moral judgments have cognitive content, like ordinary judgments about mid-sized dry goods, but our moral assertions nevertheless also express conative non-cognitive content. We might think of this as a V-shaped expressivist view of moral assertion: as a matter of convention, our moral assertions express both cognitive content and non-cognitive content. Truth and falsity apply to the former -- and since there ain't no (instantiated) moral properties, moral assertions are typically false -- whereas our motivational states and much of the function of moral discourse are systematically connected to the latter. It is an initially attractive package since it allows us to (a) maintain the common sense view that moral judgments are to be glossed with non-moral descriptive judgments, while (b) recognizing and, in a sense, legitimating a deep connection between moral assertions and our conative and affective states.

Whether the initial attraction of this package persists on inspection is another question. One of Joyce's central motivations for the expressivist portion of his view is the putative incoherence of a moral assertion that is conjoined with a denial of being in the relevant conative state:

Hitler was evil; but I subscribe to no normative standard that condemns him or his actions.

This, though, doesn't feel incoherent in the same way Moore-paradoxical constructions like:

Nazim Hikmet was a poet revolutionary, but I don't believe he was

do, at least when I force myself to hear "subscribe" in an expressivist-friendly way. I worry that insofar as this example feels incoherent, it is because "subscription to a normative standard" typically indicates belief talk, not expression talk (2014: footnote 16 and objection 6). In its most humdrum usage, we subscribe to theories and views, which is (at least usually) a kind of belief-like endorsement of descriptive content. And "evil" feels pragmatically connected with condemnation -- we usually don't believe people to be evil if we do not condemn their actions. So it is difficult to avoid hearing the above as "Hitler was evil, but I don't believe he was". More generally, I have argued that analogous, but more explicitly non-cognitive constructions simply aren't incoherent in the same way as paradigmatic Moore-paradoxical constructions. This puts pressure on the idea that expression of non-cognitive content is (partially) constitutive of competent moral assertion.

That there is a constitutive connection between moral assertion and cognitive content like belief is rather more plausible (as Joyce notes). Given that:

Hitler was evil, but I don't believe it

is flagrantly incoherent in exactly the same way as ordinary instances of Moore's paradox, expressivists need find room for belief talk. This is a lesson many recent expressivists have taken on board. This situation suggests that motivation for a Joyce-style expressivism/error-theory package will not come from arguments like the above, but rather from careful study of the overall theoretical virtues and vices of the package. As we should expect.

Chapter 2, "Morality, Schmorality," launches an investigation into the functional role of morality on the back of an analysis of whether it's bad to be bad. Joyce argues that if all (reasonable) pretenders to morality turn out to be schmoralities -- if they fail to serve the intended functional role of morality -- then we ought to be error theorists. This raises important questions about the costs of error-theory; after all, we want the functional role of morality served somehow. Joyce suggests that we might turn to a form of fictionalism here, fleshing out the common thought that we ought to carry on with our moral practices even in the wake of widespread error. He tempers this suggestion by arguing that whether or not this is the right path -- whether it is good to pretend to believe in the good -- itself depends on empirical facts about psychological feasibility and pragmatic utility (this theme is revisited later the collection.)

The complementary third chapter, "The Accidental Error Theorist," suggests that many contemporary naturalistic accounts of moral properties slip into error theory unwittingly by potentially inhuman theorizing. That is, they postulate properties which fit reality only under the presumption of implausible restrictions on what kind of beings we are. Response-dependent and sentimentalist accounts posit generic properties, such as a general disposition to feel resentment upon certain coarsely described stimuli, which we probably don't possess. For example, it is extremely implausible that we are always disposed to feel resentment in the face of unkindness; it is somewhat implausible that we are typically disposed to feel it.

Ideal observer theories and contractualist accounts, on the other hand, neglect the fact that we humans come in varieties far askew from the bourgeois moral and doxastic norm theorists in these traditions typically start with. These positions thus tend to either succumb to the temptation to cheat by building a substantive moral constraint into their account or, alternatively, attempt increasingly fraught rationalizations of counterexamples in terms of failures of information or affect. In short, many roads to error theory are paved with empirical plausibility; starting from a compelling analysis of what moral properties are, we may end up accepting it as the correct analysis of moral properties and rejecting that so-analyzed moral properties are ever instantiated.

The final essay of this section, "Metaethical Pluralism", ties these themes all together. Joyce argues that given the widespread disagreement in philosophical accounts of assertion and value, there may be no decisive reason to favor cognitivism over non-cognitivism, nor any decisive reason to favor moral naturalism over moral skepticism. The most compelling aspect of this argument is the explicit attention paid to the payoff between interpretational issues, and context-relative pragmatic concerns. The conclusion, that it might very well be that there is no decisive answer to which view is right and, more importantly, no decisive answer to which view we ought to take, strikes me as compelling. This ecumenism might seem a step back for Joyce, but I don't read it that way.

Rather, I read it as a welcome two-part shift. First, a shift away from the view that we will find sufficient grounds for error theory in explicating our moral thought and talk. Second, a shift towards treating empirical issues, such as psychological tractability and pragmatic payoff, modulated by the standpoint we start from, as an important but not decisive factor in whether we should accept an error theory or a revisionary moral naturalism. The upshot is a type of theoretical maturity: we can go on with which view we like, while recognizing that we do so by making decisions about our concepts which were not already forced. Recognizing that we could have gone another way, we might occasionally usefully flirt with the road not taken.

Turning to the second section, my competence lies entirely with the second pair of essays (chapters 7 and 8), which address moral debunking arguments. Debunking arguments argue for some skeptical position about moral judgments -- they're all false, they're all unjustified, etc. -- on the basis of an explanation of our possession of our moral beliefs that is entirely independent of the truth of our moral judgments. For example, many have argued that telling an evolutionary story about how we came to have the moral beliefs we have somehow undermines taking our moral beliefs to be accurate or justified (Street 2006, Joyce 2006). These two chapters counter the pervasive mistake of thinking that debunking arguments establish a strong version of a moral skepticism absent the addition of substantive epistemological theses which close the gap between the modest skeptical position "Theory T (currently) lacks justification" and the extreme skeptical position "Theory T is unjustifiable."

The discussion is sensible, compelling, and rich. For example, one brief footnote (7 of chapter 7) recaps a back and forth between Joyce and Justin Clarke-Doane while making the crucial point that usefulness-oriented explanations of our beliefs in certain facts, like mathematics, may (and, as I argue in my (forthcoming), typically do) require their truth, immunizing them from debunking skepticism. This chapter strikes me as one of the more important contributions of the volume. It pulls the teeth of a number of confusions about debunking, such as the idea that compelling debunking arguments require specifically evolutionary genealogical premises. It is slightly regrettable that Joyce does not here engage directly with the recent argument that evolutionary premises are the only interesting bit of the current fascination with debunking (Vavova 2014). This, however, is only a minor quibble. I hope this chapter, the only one not previously published, is widely read and thoroughly absorbed.

Chapter 8, "Irrealism and the Genealogy of Morals," continues the project of undermining vulgar takes on debunking skepticism. In particular, it reminds us that we often need to answer substantive epistemological questions, such as "when is it reasonable to move from the absence of evidence to the evidence of absence" in order to move from reasonable premises like "we lack grounds to believe in explanatorily impotent facts" to stronger premises like "we have grounds to disbelieve in explanatorily impotent facts." As Joyce points out, much of the philosophical action concerns these epistemological bridging principles.

The remainder of the essay asks whether we can run skeptical worries, analogous to evolutionary debunking arguments, against non-cognitivist views. The answer, both the right one and Joyce's, seems to be "yes." Drawing on the plausible idea that even conative and affective states like liking and disliking are conditioned by substantive appropriateness conditions, Joyce sketches some prima facie cases where we might undermine these by considerations similar to those deployed by debunkers against moral cognitivists. This seems a fruitful area to be pursued in future work by Joyce and others.

The final section takes up questions about projectivism and fictionalism. It opens with an analysis of the claim, famous from Hume and somewhat developed in Mackie (1977), that we project affective reactions, like our disgust at cruelty, onto the events and agents themselves, treating these psychological reactions as worldly properties. This is analogous to the (slightly) less contentious claim that we project our (psychological) impressions of color onto worldly objects, treating colors as worldly properties. Mackie uses projectivism to support his view that there really are no worldly moral properties, just as we might use color projectivism to support the view that there are no worldly color properties. In both cases the actual support provided by projectivism is nowise clear. A bit of thought shows that both moral and color projectivism are clearly compatible with realism about moral and color properties.

The interesting question is whether there are compelling abductive arguments for moral skepticism that moral projectivism supports. Joyce explores two possibilities, both due to Mackie, and locates the role projectivism plays in each. He finds that Mackie's earlier and more prima facie compelling argument suffers from dialectical sloppiness. It first uses projectivism as a tie-breaker fact arbitrating between conservativism about moral beliefs and conservativism about naturalistic beliefs. It then uses projectivism as itself an argument for the bizarreness of moral properties. But the bizarreness of moral properties is used to support conservativism about naturalistic beliefs. Joyce's reconstruction of Mackie's sloppiness strikes me as plausible, though I wish he had addressed whether we could rejigger Mackie's argument to avoid the circularity.

What Joyce really thinks is that Mackie should have provided empirical support for moral projectivism before using it as a tiebreaker. Chapter 10 explores this, arguing that minimal projectivism, the view that "we experience moral wrongness as an objective feature of the world", can and should be interpreted as an empirical hypothesis. What will come out of testing this hypothesis is an open question, but if we could justify it empirically, we could then feed it back into Mackie's argument above to produce a compelling (though hardly bulletproof) argument for moral skepticism. In this sense, at least, we can answer Joyce's coy closing question about whether minimal moral projectivism is interesting once made empirically tractable: yes, definitely.

The final two essays discuss fictionalism, first moral, then psychological. Joyce has a vivid sense of the limitations and advantages of such views and a wicked eye for where the real problems for them lie. The last essay, which I will not address in depth, claims psychological fictionalism is more problematic than moral fictionalism, but still salvageable. It does excellent work in undermining overly pat "how could we believe it?" arguments against both fictionalism and eliminativism about folk psychology.

Chapter 11, "Moral Fictionalism," develops Joyce's favored brand of fictionalism and defends it from a number of worries. His moral fictionalism is revolutionary (we're not already pretending, but we should start pretending) and game-oriented (we pretend to morally assert, we don't assert of the moral pretense). Fictionalizing is claimed to be a reasonable thing to do in our day-to-day lives when we find ourselves, in our more critical moments, disavowing moral facts. The set-up strikes me as slightly strange, especially given Joyce's claim that the notion of a critical moment doesn't involve significant idealization. Taking our actual critical moments as indicative of what we really believe strikes me as problematic since our critical "classroom" moments are still governed by social pressure and confounds. Years in academia have trained me to not take seminar or classroom discussion as indicative of what people really believe. So I worry about Joyce's starting point, even though I find the general approach reasonable.

There are a number of other immediate worries, such as whether "pretending to assert" is really what we do when we speak as sophisticated skeptics in a vulgar world. I reckon 'no', though I also reckon that Joyce could have said "non-committal assertion in line with and governed by the rules of the moral fiction" instead and avoided this sort of objection. Putting that aside, pretend assertion raises other interesting worries. Contrast pretend promises: pretend promises, insofar as they have uptake, are still promises. We can cross our fingers behind our back all we like, we've still promised, goddamn it. Is pretend assertion likewise still assertion?

The answer depends on whether we take assertion to be publicly governed (like promises) or not. Joyce writes suggestively that we need not take moral fictionalists, when fictionalizing, as liars or, alternatively, we could take them as blameless. I would have liked to see Joyce's take on whether we have asserted at all, in the sense of being committed to what we have said, when we pretend assert. After all, few of us are fictionalists, and rare perverse linguistic intentions don't typically determine meaning or commitment.

Joyce closes by asking whether it is in our interest to be moral fictionalists. This, like so many of the questions Joyce raises, is largely an empirical cum psychological question. And one that Joyce suggests might be answered by a focus on the role of particular unexamined moral beliefs (precommitments) in reinforcing useful behavioral patterns. Our "precommitment" to morality might help stave off weakness of will, for example. This strikes me as plausible, not only for moral fictionalists, but also for various forms of moral conventionalism. One final worry is whether Joyce has overly narrowed his focus by treating eliminativism and fictionalism as the only responses to moral error theory. Moving to a small-m moral conventionalism (or relativism, if you prefer) once we've seen that our moral beliefs don't track objective reality strikes me as equi-reasonable. It is not clear that we would lose much of the desired effect on our behavior since, after all, formal norms like those of etiquette also stave off weakness of will: they're certainly "real", we're precommited to them, and yet we hardly pretend they're objective in the way suggested by moral fictionalism.

As any review that closes on a list of questions like this indicates, Joyce's book is an interesting, occasionally frustrating, massively stimulating read. The delicate contours of moral error theory, skepticisms, and related territory are mapped out here better than anywhere else. Moreover, Joyce does not skip the hard questions, while being unafraid to leave the reader hungry for more answers. It would be good reading for anyone with a passing interest. It is essential reading for anyone with anything more. Even though the essays are largely previously published, they mesh together into a cloud of views, questions, lunges and dodges that are best read together. This volume is a rare and welcome case of a collection of an author's previous work being much more than the sum of its parts.


Joyce, Richard (2006). The Evolution of Morality. MIT Press.

Mackie, J. L. (1977). Ethics: Inventing Right and Wrong. Penguin Books.

Street, Sharon (2006). "A Darwinian Dilemma for Realist Theories of Value." Philosophical Studies 127 (1): 109-166.

Vavova, Katia (2014). "Debunking Evolutionary Debunking." Oxford Studies in Metaethics 9: 76-101.

Woods, Jack (2014). "Expressivism and Moore's Paradox." Philosophers' Imprint 14 (5): 1-12.

Woods, Jack (2016). "Mathematics, Morality, and Self‐Effacement." Noûs 50 (4).