Essays in the Metaphysics of Modality

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Plantinga, Alvin, Essays in the Metaphysics of Modality, Matthew Davidson (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2003, 248pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195103777.

Reviewed by Charles Chihara, University of California, Berkeley


This book consists of an introduction by the editor, eleven of Plantinga’s previously published pieces, and an index. The previously published works are presented in the following chronological order: “De Re et De Dicto” (1969); “World and Essence” (1970); “Transworld Identity or Worldbound Individuals?” (1973); Chapter VIII of The Nature of Necessity (1974); “Actualism and Possible Worlds” (1976); “The Boethian Compromise” (1978); “De Essentia” (1979); “On Existentialism” (1983); “Reply to John L. Pollock” (1985); “Two Concepts of Modality: Modal Realism and Modal Reductionism” (1987); and “Why Propositions Cannot Be Concrete” (1993).

In all these works, Plantinga makes reference to, and relies upon, the entities of the metaphysical theory he has been developing for more than thirty years. These include states of affairs, propositions, properties, functions, and sets. Thus, in the very first of these pieces—a work to a large extent concerned with defending the coherence of de re modality against the objections of various philosophers—one finds Plantinga making heavy use of propositions, properties, and functions. One can see why the book is entitled “Essays in the Metaphysics of Modality”.

It is in the second of these essays that Plantinga introduces what are to become the basic entities of his metaphysics of modality: states of affairs. States of affairs are held to be abstract entities that such phrases as ’George Bush being a Yale graduate’ and ’Laura Bush having run for the presidency’ refer to. Some states of affairs obtain, others do not. The first of the two phrases I mentioned above supposedly refers to a state of affairs that obtains; the second one supposedly refers to a state of affairs that does not obtain. The concept of state of affairs is used to define what a possible world is. For Plantinga, a possible world is just a state of affairs that is “fully determinate” in a way to be explained shortly. We first define two relations among the states of affairs: for all states of affairs S and S*, S includes S* if S could not obtain if S* did not obtain; and S precludes S* if S could not obtain if S* did obtain. Now a state of affairs P is a possible world iff, for every state of affairs S, P either includes S or precludes S. In this essay, Plantinga uses his newly defined notion of possible world to define the concept of having a property essentiall y and the concept of an essence. Armed with these fundamental modal notions, Plantinga investigates some important questions in the philosophy of language. In particular, he subjects John Searle’s “cluster” account of proper names to a detailed and thorough examination (one very different from Saul Kripke’s examination of the account in Naming and Necessity), concluding that Searle is mistaken in thinking that the disjunction of the “identity criteria associated with a proper name” (that is, the properties we use to locate and identify the bearer of the name) is an essential property of the bearer of that name (p. 56). This essay clearly illustrates how the modal concepts Plantinga had specified could be fruitfully used in the analysis and refutation of philosophical positions and arguments in a variety of areas of philosophy.

In “Transworld Identity or Worldbound Individuals”, Plantinga focuses on the sort of modal theory developed in David Lewis’s counterpart theory. Making use of the modal concepts he had articulated in “World and Essence”, Plantinga attacks the various arguments that had been put forward to support the idea that individuals are “world-bound” (that is, occur in only one world). Thus, taking aim at what was widely supposed to be the most convincing case for accepting counterpart theory, namely the argument that counterpart theory provides the best solution to the Problem of Transworld Identity, Plantinga provides his own dissolution of the problem and then argues that the reasoning underlying the problem is simply confused.

The fourth of the essays in this work, Chapter VIII of The Nature of Necessity, is principally an argument in favor of Actualism—the doctrine that “there neither are nor could be any nonexistent objects”. Plantinga is especially concerned in this chapter to refute the “Classical Argument” for the claim that there are or could be objects that do not exist. This argument proceeds from the following three premises:

(1) There are some singular negative existential propositions.
(2) Some singular negative existentials are possibly true.
(3) Any world in which a singular proposition is true is one in which there is such a thing as its subject, or in which its subject has being if not existence.

Plantinga provides a convincing refutation of this argument, again relying upon the metaphysical machinery he had developed earlier. Along the way, Plantinga provides a useful analysis of fictional names.

In “Actualism and Possible Worlds”, Plantinga claims that the more or less standard possible worlds semantics of modal logic developed by Kripke engenders confusions because “it suggests that there are things that do not exist” (p. 105). This fifth essay in the collection aims at producing an account of possible worlds that allows us to retain the insights and understanding achieved by the Kripkean “Canonical Conception of possible worlds”, while clearly retaining the actualistic position. This essay presents most of the modal concepts of his theory in essentially the form developed in the earlier essays, but now the concepts are presented in a more systematic and perspicuous manner.

“The Boethian Compromise” is concerned with the dispute between those who support the “Fregean view” of proper names, according to which “proper names are semantically equivalent to descriptions” and the Millians who claim that proper names “denote the individuals who are called by them, but they do not indicate or imply an attribute as belonging to these individuals” (p. 122). The Boethian compromise that Plantinga supports is: “proper names express essences, and different names of the same object may express epistemologically inequivalent essences” (p. 137).

In the later essays in this collection, Plantinga defends serious actualism, the view that “(necessarily) no object has a property in a world in which it does not exist”,1 rejects existentialism, the view that “quidditative properties2 and singular propositions are ontologically dependent upon the individuals they involve” (p. 160), and argues that—contrary to what is widely believed—David Lewis is not a genuine modal realist. The last of the essays is aimed at showing that propositions cannot be concrete (and hence that propositions cannot be the sets of possible worlds that David Lewis claims that they are).

Looking back on the historical development of Plantinga’s metaphysics of modality, one sees a philosopher who, early on, hit upon some philosophical tools for carrying out fruitful conceptual analyses of modal reasoning of all sorts. It would seem, from the papers in the collection being reviewed, that Plantinga was more concerned about exploiting the tools he had discovered than with putting his ontological theory on a firm foundation. Thus, in the ninth piece in the collection, his reply to Pollock, Plantinga sets out to prove that there is at least one possible world and that, for any state of affair S, S is possible iff there is a possible world in which S obtains.3 In the course of giving these proofs, Plantinga makes use of the following principles:

[1] States of affairs exist.
[2] Every state of affairs S has a complement S’.
[3] If S is a state of affairs, then necessarily either S or S’ obtains.
[4] Given any possible state of affairs S, there exists a set whose members are all those possible states of affairs that include S.
[5] Given any set b of states of affairs, the conjunction of that set, all the members of b having obtained, exists.

In addition to the above five, he also appeals to even stronger principles, such as:

[Expansion] For any possible state of affairs S, there exists a maximal possible state of affairs that includes S.
[Sets of states of affairs] For any state of affairs S, there is a set of all states of affairs that are possible and that include S.
[Quasi-compactness] For any set of possible states of affairs α, if α has a maximal linearly ordered subset, then α has a maximal linearly ordered subset that has the quasi-compactness property.4

He also makes use of a form of the Axiom of Choice known as “Housdorff’s maximal principle”. Yet, nowhere does Plantinga put forward a formalized (or even an informally axiomatized) theory of the entities of his metaphysical theory. Principles of entity existence seem to be pulled “out of the air”, so-to-speak, as they are needed. The developmental state of Plantinga’s ontological theory is comparable to that of naive set theory in the second half of the Nineteenth Century. Like naive set theory, Plantinga’s theory of states of affairs seems to be based upon a sort of abstraction axiom: Plantinga acts as if, given practically any gerund phrase, there is a state of affairs that the phrase denotes. He also seems to believe that, given any sentence attributing a property P to an object x, there is a state of affairs corresponding to the phrase ’x having the property P’.

Given the well-known history of naive set theory, one would think that Plantinga would exhibit some concern, in these papers, about the possible inconsistency of his theory—especially since his ontological theory can be shown to be inconsistent with the axioms of standard set theory.5 The big question is: can this ontological theory be revised in a way that makes it, on the one hand, immune from paradox and, on the other hand, strong enough to do the job Plantinga wants it to do? I dare say, achieving such a revision would not be easy. Scanning the above principles that Plantinga has accepted, one can see that the existence of states of affairs is intimately related to the existence of both sets and properties. Indeed, the existence of these distinct types of entities are so interrelated that coming up with a reasonable limitation of the existence assumptions of the system in a way that would yield a consistent system seems to me to be a formidable task indeed.


1. P. 179. Plantinga also supplies, in this piece, a deduction of serious actualism from actualism

2. Here's how Plantinga explains what a quidditative property is. The thisness of an individual is the property of being that individual. A property is quidditative is either a thisness or involves a thisness in a certain way. This "certain way" is explained by way of examples: Being identical with Nero. Being more bloodthirsty than Nero. Being possibly Nero. Being believed by Nero to be treacherous. (See page 159 for other examples).

3. Actually, Pollock gives a proof of these propositions, but Plantinga sets out to prove them using what he takes to be weaker premises.

4. A maximal linearly ordered set A has the quasi-compactness property iff, A is possible if every finite subset of A is possible. A set of states of affairs is possible iff it is possible that all of its members obtain. A 'maximally linearly ordered subset' is a subset that is linearly ordered by the proper inclusion relation and which is maximal in the sense that there is no linearly ordered subset that properly includes (in the set theoretical sense) it.

5. See my The Worlds of Possibility: Modal Realism and the Semantics of Modal Logic (1998, Oxford University Press), pp. 126 f.