Essays in the Philosophy of Religion

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Philip L. Quinn, Essays in the Philosophy of Religion, Christian B. Miller (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2006, 315pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199297047.

Reviewed by Robert C. Roberts, Baylor University


This book is a posthumous collection of some of the best papers of a distinguished, many-sided philosopher of religion, edited by one of his last students. The foreword is a humorous, piquant, and appreciative personal reminisence by Eleonore Stump. Christian B. Miller's introduction gives the gist, and in some cases reviews the polemical background, of each of the papers. The book has six sections: religious ethics, religion and tragic dilemmas, religious epistemology, religion and political liberalism, topics in Christian philosophy, and religious diversity.

"Religious Obedience and Moral Autonomy" (1975) is a response to a well known moral argument by James Rachels for the non-existence of God, to the effect that no being could be a fitting object of human worship because the attitude that such a being's commands would require from us would be inconsistent with our moral autonomy. Quinn argues first that the conclusion does not follow, because it is possible either that God issues no commands or that the commands he issues are consistent with the conscience of a morally autonomous agent. Rachels might respond that the theist's reliance on his rational moral intuitions in judging whether or not to obey a purported command of God is itself a violation of the attitude of worship, because in relying on his own intuitions the theist is making his obedience to God conditional and thus not truly worshipful. If so, says Quinn, Rachels would be confusing placing (moral) conditions on one's obedience to God with placing (epistemic) conditions on one's judgment about whether a purported command of God actually was a command. But, Rachels might say, surely God could command anything, and thus might command that the human agent relinquish his moral autonomy; this possibility shows that worship of God is in principle inconsistent with our moral autonomy. Quinn responds that the theist can deny that God could command just anything, since the idea of God is that of a morally perfect being. Still, dilemmas between one's moral beliefs and what one has good reason to suppose God is commanding seem empirically possible (consider, for example, Abraham, who might well think that killing one's children is wrong yet is faced with a purported command to kill his son Isaac). One can easily resolve such a dilemma by denying, of any purported command to do what seems inconsistent with one's considered moral sense, that it is really a command of God. But alternatively, the theist may think that if God commands a person to do what appears to him wrong, he may in fact be wrong about the apparent wrongness. If the person acts on the judgment that his sense of the act's wrongness should be overridden, he does so with moral autonomy from "within his own conceptual framework" (p. 32). Lastly, Quinn explores some possible conceptions of subservient (obedient) and autonomous (motivationally correct) that might conflict and thus create trouble for the theist who wishes to endorse human subservience to God's will without undermining moral autonomy. He briefly attempts to show that such conceptions would entail morally unpalatable assumptions.

Quinn begins "Divine Commands: A Causal Theory" (1980) by rejecting metaethical divine command theories according to which the meaning of 'x is morally required' (for example) is identical with that of 'God commands x.' If such theories purport to reflect ordinary usage, they err; if they stipulate, they are uninteresting. Quinn instead constructs a normative divine command theory according to which x is morally required (for example) because and only because God commands x (he states this view more formally than I do here). Most of the paper consists in answering possible objections to this theory. The paper's goal is the modest one of showing "that a reasonable person would, other things being equal, not be completely justified in regarding the theory … as false" (43).  Quinn discusses the following objections.

Skeptical problems. Objection 1: If the theory is right, we have to know what God commands before we can tell right from wrong, which is absurd. Reply: The theory isn't about how we know what is right, but about how what is right gets to be right. Objection 2: The theory provides no decision procedure in ethics. Reply: It wasn't designed to do so. Objection 3: If moral principles are based on religious truths, then all the difficulties of achieving agreement in religion will likewise appear in ethics. Reply: "[T]he mere fact that a theory … provokes disagreement is by itself no reason for disbelieving that theory" (46).

Nihilism problem. One consequence of Quinn's causal divine command theory is that if either God does not exist, or God exists but commands nothing, then all actions are morally permitted. But it seems that not all actions are morally permitted. It follows then that God exists and issues commands. So Quinn's theory is unpalatable to atheists, at least to ones who aren't moral nihilists. Reply: This would be a problem for Quinn's theory only if it were proven that God doesn't exist, and this has not been done.

Conflicts of obligation. It seems possible that God should command both p and ~p, thus causing conflicting obligations, as appears to be the case in the Abraham and Isaac story. This would violate the principle that if p is obligatory, then ~p is not obligatory, thus creating trouble for the causal divine command theory. Reply: The principle that if p is obligatory, then ~p is not obligatory is doubted by competent ethicists, and there do seem to be conflicts of obligation. Since the principle is problematic, it raises no serious difficulty for the divine command theory.

Cudworth's objection. This is the most troubling objection for Quinn's theory. Some obligations, such as the prohibition of gratuitous torture, seem to be necessary truths. But Quinn's theory makes all obligations contingent on God's commanding them. Quinn suggests two possible responses. One is to bite the bullet and deny that any moral obligations are necessary truths. A way to make this scenario plausible is to suppose with Ockham that God can create all the essential features of an action, such as hating God or torturing innocents for pleasure, without causing it to be wicked. Its wickedness would then be contingent on God's further action of making it so. The other possibility is to limit Quinn's theory by allowing that some obligations are not contingent on God's commanding them.

"The Primacy of God's Will in Christian Ethics" (1992) has two parts. The first argues that three considerations to which orthodox Christians adhere -- the concept of divine sovereignty, the Old Testament attestation of "the immoralities of the patriarchs," and the love command found in the Gospels -- cumulatively support a divine command theory of obligation. The second part of the essay attempts "to show that theological voluntarism is superior to" Aristotelian virtue theory, "the rival contender that currently enjoys the greatest popularity among Christian philosophers" (54).

Divine sovereignty. Quinn considers efforts by Tom Morris and Michael Loux to extend to necessary truths the sovereignty that many Christians believe God exercises over contingent existence. Loux proposes "extravagantly" (59) that God creates all necessary truths by believing them in the strong sense that he believes the propositions and does not entertain their negation. Quinn points out that some necessary truths are not plausibly created by God's believing them, for example, the proposition that God exists. Nevertheless, necessary moral truths (if there are any) may be created by God's believing them, and given the intimate connection between God's beliefs and his will, we might suppose that the status of such propositions as moral truths would be mediated to them by God's willing them. Thus we maintain a kind of theological voluntarism for moral truths, even necessary ones. Quinn points out that the claim may need to be restricted further to a particular kind of moral truth, namely truths about obligations.

Immoralities of the patriarchs. The Old Testament contains stories according to which God commanded righteous individuals like Abraham and Hosea, or the whole people of Israel, to perform actions that would otherwise be immoral, such as killing one's own innocent son, sleeping with an adulteress, or stealing, thus making these "immoral" actions the right thing to do. Quinn discusses various respected Church fathers who endorse this reading, thus holding that the bottom line on morality is obedience to the will of God. Thomas Aquinas is particularly interesting, since he holds that God, being God, can change the moral status of an action that in the absence of his special command would count as murder, fornication, or theft. For example, when God commanded the Israelites to "plunder the Egyptians," the action he was requiring of them was not theft, since the property of the Egyptians became, through the command, the property of the Israelites.

Commanded love. In the Gospels, Jesus of Nazareth endorses the divine command to love one's neighbor. Quinn gives special attention to Søren Kierkegaard's interpretation in Works of Love: "no Christian thinker has seen with greater clarity … just how radical the demands of love of neighbor are" (65). Love of neighbor is love for any person who crosses one's path, and so involves no discrimination in favor of people who are attractive, virtuous, or reciprocating of affection, and no discrimination against people who are repulsive, vicious, or hateful toward oneself. Such a love, so different from friendship and romantic attachment, is sufficiently contrary to natural human inclinations that it must be conceived as an obligation imposed by the external authority of God, and to which one approximates only by discipline, self-denial, and perhaps divine aid.

In the final pages of his paper Quinn contrasts the divine command conception of obligation, as a Christian ethical theory, with what he takes to be its chief rival option, an Aristotle-inspired virtue ethics. This discussion brings out more clearly than any earlier one how Quinn conceives the goal of philosophical ethics and the role of the philosopher. He dismisses, as incompatible with Christian thought, secular Aristotelianism, which accepts Aristotle’s idea that human beings can become virtuous without divine aid, loving their friends but certainly not their "neighbors" (including the poor in spirit, the sorrowing, and the lowly) and without their virtues involving any personal relationship with God. But even with the proper Christian adjustments of the virtue concepts, Quinn thinks the Christian ethicist should resist Aristotelian ethics:

For Aristotle, the virtues hold pride of place in ethical theory. They are not properly understood as dispositions to produce independently defined or recognizable good actions or states of affairs; rather good actions or states of affairs are defined as those a virtuous person would voluntarily produce in the appropriate circumstances. From the point of view of the divine command theorist, Aristotle has got things backwards (71).

I think one will look in vain in Aristotle's writings for the claim that good actions are defined as those a virtuous person would voluntarily produce in the appropriate circumstances. One hears this sort of thing from Michael Slote, Rosalind Hursthouse, Gary Watson, and others who try to describe what "virtue theory" would be. On their view, "virtue ethics" is another "ethical theory" on the model of consequentialisms and deontologies that "define" good actions in terms of good states of affairs or practical rationality or some such thing, with the difference that virtue theory makes virtue the fundamental concept. The goal of moral philosophy, on this view, is to produce a theory that makes some one concept central or fundamental, and derives the other moral concepts from the preferred one. By this standard, moral philosophers like Aristotle and Thomas Aquinas, not to speak of Kierkegaard, look pretty messy. Quinn notes that "when engaged in moral thinking, [Aquinas] is a bit of a magpie, picking up bits and pieces of lore from a variety of sources." He does make obedience to God's commands fundamental, but buries this key point "in a single question … more than half way through the second part of the second part of the Summa Theologiæ," where he classifies it "as a part of a part of the virtue of justice" (71). If Aquinas' aim in his ruminations about ethics was to produce an ethical theory in the modern sense, he certainly did write very oddly, devoting vast stretches of the Summa and other writings to detailed discussions of a multitude of virtues, as well as many other key ethical concepts. Maybe his purpose, like that of Aristotle before him and Kierkegaard after him, was neither more nor less than to clarify the concepts of ethics, in all of their messy and complicated interrelatedness, with the hope that his reflections would make their way, by one route or another, into the understanding, and thus the practices, of people.

But it would be hasty to conclude that Quinn conceives philosophy as a purely reductive-theoretical enterprise. In "Moral Obligation, Religious Demand, and Practical Conflict" (1986) he argues for the possibility of situations of "Kierkegaardian Conflict" -- situations, that is, in which a divine command creates an indefeasible religious obligation that conflicts with an indefeasible moral obligation, and in which a person is epistemically justified in believing himself to be in such a situation. In the Epilogue of the paper he points out that philosophy can be edifying when it "brings us to see new possibilities," and he says, "This paper has been an attempt to edify by broadening our horizon of possibilities." He then comments that people to whom he has presented his argument are often "preoccupied with actualities. They ask, But do situations of Kierkegaardian conflict actually occur?" and here his ruminations become personal. He notes that if he seemed to be subject to a divine command that conflicted with an indefeasible moral obligation, he would, unlike Abraham, invariably conclude that the apparent command was not divine. And he ends the paper by saying, "But perhaps the range of my imagination is severely constricted just because I am to a large extent the product of an incredulous culture. If so, then the fact that I can conceive possibilities I cannot quite imagine being actual for me may give me a hint about how grace might be needed to work certain kinds of religious transformation in my life" (91).

The personal, and even pastoral, strain in Quinn's philosophical work comes out strongly in "Tragic Dilemmas, Suffering Love, and Christian Life" (1989), a discussion of Shusaku Endo's novel Silence. In the opinion of Quinn's editor, Christian B. Miller, this paper is "the deepest, the most stimulating, and indeed the best piece that Quinn ever wrote" (7), and I can believe this, though I haven't read enough of Quinn's work to make the judgment for myself. The previous paper was about tragic dilemmas created by the conflict of religious with moral duties; this one is about a similarly wrenching conflict between two Christian duties, the duty of loyalty to the Savior and the duty to love one's neighbor. The story, and Quinn's philosophical treatment of it, are too rich and complex to summarize here, but suffice it to say that Quinn's discussion displays and provokes rare and inspiring insight into possibilities of moral suffering created by Christianity itself, and the nature of the grace and hope that can arise out of such suffering.

The next two papers, "In Search of the Foundations of Theism" (1985) and "The Foundations of Theism Again: Rejoinder to Plantinga" (1993), contain Quinn's criticisms of Alvin Plantinga's Reformed Epistemology. As Quinn remarks at the end of the second essay, his differences with Plantinga center about the value of natural theology: Plantinga tends to think it not very important for most believers while Quinn estimates its value quite a bit higher. In these papers the theme of pressures toward unbelief exerted by the secular culture in which sophisticated Christians live plays a crucial role in Quinn's argument, and shows another pastoral dimension of his conception of philosophy's importance. Plantinga argues that, for many theists, belief in God is properly basic -- not in need of any evidential support -- and that classical foundationalism, which is the doctrine behind the supposition that one is justified in believing in God only if one has evidence supporting that belief (evidence of the kind that natural theology tries to supply), is self-referentially inconsistent, since by its own standard of justified belief, the belief in classical foundationalism is not justified. Quinn responds by calling into question the claim that for most believers belief in God is properly basic. He thinks that intellectually sophisticated adult theists in our culture are aware of weighty considerations ("defeaters") against belief in God, such that their belief cannot be justified unless they have some answer to these objections. And he rejects Plantinga's refutation of classical foundationalism, arguing that, though Plantinga is right that the foundationalist criterion of justification is not self-evidently true, it might well be such that the foundationalist could find properly basic beliefs on which to base it. She might follow Plantinga's suggestion of an inductive method of collecting a fund of properly basic beliefs, and a fund of beliefs requiring a basis in other beliefs, according to one's tradition (say, the Christian tradition or the classical foundationalist tradition), and from there reach settled hypotheses concerning necessary and sufficient conditions for justification. In the later paper Quinn loses some of his optimism about the foundationalist's ability to make this kind of response work, but notes also that Plantinga has not worked out a full account of the necessary and sufficient conditions for proper basicality within Christian thought. He concludes that the dispute between Reformed Epistemology and classical foundationalism is a standoff, but still maintains that Plantinga has greatly underestimated the importance of natural theology as a support for believers.

"Political Liberalisms and Their Exclusion of the Religious" (1995) and "Religious Citizens within the Limits of Public Reason" (2001) are about the use of specifically religious premises in public policy debates. Quinn writes as a political liberal, and argues in the earlier article (which was an APA Central Division presidential address) that a genuinely liberal outlook will place very few restrictions on religious motivations and the use of theological premises in public debate. In the first of these papers Quinn's chief interlocutors are Robert Audi, John Rawls, and Michael J. Perry. Audi proposes that we have a duty, when advocating or supporting public policy restrictions on human conduct, to appeal to or be overridingly motivated by only secular reasons, that is, not to or by any considerations that presuppose the existence of God or the authority of a sacred text or religious leader. Rawls proposes a "duty of civility" that prescribes that premises in debates over matters of constitutional essentials or matters of basic justice come only from what he calls "public reason," thus excluding any appeal to justifications deriving from "comprehensive doctrines" such as religions or philosophical theories. Perry develops a model of "ecumenical political dialogue" (180) that allows people to bring their religious premises into political debate as long as they embrace the ideal of self-critical rationality and value moral diversity because it leads to deepened moral insights. Perry later abandons even the exclusions implied by these two conditions and advocates complete inclusiveness of religious points of view in political debates. Quinn endorses this position, with one qualification: a moral but not legal restriction on behavior that is extremely disrespectful (for example, hate speech) or implies "a lack of equality of groups of citizens" (184).

In the later paper Quinn turns from criticizing Rawls to defending Rawls's idea of public reason (which in the meantime Rawls had moderated a bit) against criticisms of Nicholas Wolterstorff. One criticism is that political liberalism greatly exaggerates the importance of consensus as a basis for instituting laws and policies that are in any way coercive. But, says Quinn, no such extreme position originates with Rawls, who "insists that even within the limits of public reason there will be different formulations of the principles of justice" (199). Wolterstorff's main objection to Rawls is that the idea of public reason unfairly excludes from public debate appeals to reasons peculiar to comprehensive religious doctrines. Quinn expounds two forms of the argument, the free exercise argument and the integrity argument. As Quinn reads him, Wolterstorff interprets Rawls's "duty of civility" as infringing on religious people's freedom to practice their religion, since many religious people think they should base their political decisions concerning matters of fundamental justice on their religious beliefs. Quinn points out that Rawls is not proposing that it be made illegal to base one's political arguments on religious premises, but only that people have a moral duty not to do so. Religious people are free to violate this duty and (I think surely) will disagree with Rawls as to whether there is such a duty. Since the duty of civility does not give any adherent of it the right to prevent another from violating it, it does not infringe on people's religious freedom. The integrity argument is that some religious people want to integrate their religious with their political beliefs, and to the extent that political liberalism prevails in a society, it undermines such integrationist practice. Quinn agrees that religious integrity in this sense will be undermined to the extent that political liberalism prevails, but does not agree that such an outcome is unfair. "I endorse [Isaiah] Berlin's view that there is no social world without loss" (204). Quinn admits that religious integrity in Wolterstorff's sense may be valuable, but it is just part of social evolution that some good things are lost in the process, and there's nothing unfair about that. Quinn ends this essay by saying that while he endorses Rawls's idea of public reason as an ideal, he does not think that it can impose a moral duty as long as it is unattainable in present circumstances. Clearly, Quinn is less attached to religious political integrity than Wolterstorff, but the concession at the end of this essay seems to me to suggest that his treatment of Wolterstorff has been less charitable than it might have been.

"'In Adam's Fall, We Sinned All'" (1988) and "Christian Atonement and Kantian Justification" (1986) are searching critical expositions of Saint Anselm's and Immanuel Kant's Christian theories of original sin and Christ's atonement. Quinn surveys the difficulties facing the four theories, taking with utmost seriousness the assumption (shared by the primary authors) that original sin, like other sin, is a kind of moral delinquency (thus either originating in culpable action of the sinful agent or deserving of punishment as though the agent is culpable) and that justification resulting from the atonement is a standard kind of moral justification (thus making the sinful agent, in his own person, worthy of moral acquittal). The results are not particularly heartening for adherents of traditional Christian doctrine. Quinn points out at the end of the second paper that salvation need not come by way of justification, since it might come through a merciful forgiveness of sins on God's part; but this solution leaves Christians with the question expressed by the last sentence of the paper: "Why, then, did God become man?" (254).

"Kantian Philosophical Ecclesiology" (2000) discusses Kant's theory of the church as the universal moral community. Particular empirical manifestations of the church will have historically conditioned doctrines and rites ("ecclesiastical faith"), but these constitute a dispensable outer ring surrounding the essential commonwealth of persons who have carried out a revolution in themselves against the propensity to evil from which all human beings suffer. (Members do this by adopting a metamaxim to the effect that they will put duty before inclination.) The church is essentially this community of duty-adherents, adherents to "the pure religion of reason," so it becomes more perfectly the true visible church to the extent that it recognizes the trappings of ecclesiastical faith to be a mere external husk. However, Quinn points out that Kant accepts the possibility and even the reality of divine revelation, inasmuch as he thinks that Christianity is a revelation from God and at the same time is perfectly compatible with pure rationality. In other words, the truths of Christianity might have been discovered by pure rational reflection, but as a matter of historical fact they are divinely revealed, particularly in the New Testament. This fact provides a hermeneutic for reading the New Testament, namely the policy of supposing that everything it says is compatible with Kantian practical rationality. This may require some stretched readings, but they are legitimate inasmuch as reason trumps purported revelation. This same hermeneutic makes for increased religious toleration, since recognizing the due subjection of religious doctrines and practices to the canons of practical reason makes one less inclined to insist on peculiarities of one's own ecclesiastical faith. Quinn notes that consensus about what reason prescribes is harder to come by in our era than Kant thought it was, and so proposes a chastened Kantianism that construes practical rationality in terms of reflective equilibrium and is less confident about the power of reason to trump revelation. He ends this interesting paper by assessing the ecclesiological changes stemming from the Second Vatican Council in light of both Kant's rationalism and his own modified Kantianism and concludes that this development of the Catholic Church does partially conform to these Kantian standards.

In "Towards Thinner Theologies: Hick and Alston on Religious Diversity" (1995), Quinn considers first John Hick's effort to construct a solution to the "problem" of religious diversity. The problem arises for religious people who have a realist conception of whatever transcendent reality they believe in, when they consider that equally rational and mature adherents of other major religions have conceptions of reality that are incompatible with their own. An inclusivist solution, for philosophers like Hick and Quinn, will have to credit all the major religions with truth, despite their initial or apparent adherence to logically contrary beliefs. Hick's solution distinguishes phenomenal from noumenal religious objects. In particular historical religions, the phenomenally inaccessible noumenal Real appears to the adherents of the religion through the concepts and practices of that religion. For example, in Christianity God appears in the guise of personal Creator, Redeemer, Father, Son, Holy Spirit, etc., while in advaitic Hinduism the noumenal Real appears as impersonal. The truth, according to Hick, is that no property phenomenally attributed to the noumenal Real is true of it. Thus all theologies and atheologies (except for purely formal propositions about the transcendent) are objectively false, despite the fact that the noumenal Real is real and is somehow the source of all the canonical religious impressions had by adherents of the various world religions. Hick's "solution" to the problem of religious pluralism thus comes at the cost of denying much of what the adherents of the religions take to be essential to their views, and at the cost of the coherency of Hick's own position since, despite his realism about the transcendent, he can say nothing coherent about it. Quinn proposes a revised inclusively pluralist approach that is nevertheless realist: to search the religions to be included for pairwise contrary attributions and then "postulate a common religious ultimate that has no property which entails either member of any contrary pair" (290). The particular phenomenal appearances of this Ultimate in the different religions would then be explained either as diverse (and, I suppose, partially false) ways of construing the same thing, or by postulating different objects (which I suppose would have to be different aspects of the Ultimate). Quinn notes that the resulting theology would be too thin for the palate of "most current members of the great religious traditions" (290), but also notes, with some hopefulness, that religions have evolved in the past and might in the future evolve in some such converging way. He ends the paper by considering William P. Alston's doxastic practices approach to the epistemic rationality of Christianity under the warrant-weakening condition of known religious pluralism, and concludes that while Alston is right that practitioners of the Christian Mystical Practice are justified in persevering in that practice despite their awareness of rival, equally justified, mystical practices, Alston has not shown that perseverance is the only rational course of action. "In particular, [Alston's argument has not impugned] the rationality of those Christians who are prepared to move in the direction of thicker phenomenologies and thinner theologies, even if they are not yet ready to go all the way to the Hickian view that it is nothing but phenomenology almost all the way down" (299). In the short, last paper of the book, "On Religious Diversity & Tolerance" (2005), Quinn recommends the warrant-reducing effect of religious pluralism as a buffer against the baleful effects of religious intolerance.

Quinn's Kantianism, and more broadly his openness to compromise on some of the distinctive features of Christian faith, will not, I judge, be to the taste of most Christian philosophers. But this excellent selection of his papers on religion leaves one with high esteem for a thoroughly expert philosopher who was also a deep, compassionate, and truthful human being.