Essays on A Priori Knowledge and Justification

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Albert Casullo, Essays on A Priori Knowledge and Justification, Oxford University Press, 2012, 344pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199777860.

Reviewed by Ali Hasan, University of Iowa


The last thirty years or so have seen a significant resurgence of interest in the a priori. Albert Casullo's collection of excellent essays spans this period. The first six published essays (from 1977 to 2002) provide background to and central arguments for a number of themes covered in A Priori Justification (2003): (1) a defense of a minimal analysis of a priori justified belief as nonexperientially justified belief; (2) a critique of traditional criteriological arguments both for and against the existence of the a priori -- arguments that appeal to necessity, certainty, and empirical irrefutability or indefeasibility as criteria for a priori knowledge (or justification); (3) a critique of Laurence BonJour's (1998) argument that rationalism is preferable to empiricism since the rejection of the a priori leads to radical skepticism; (4) an assessment of the reliabilist approach to the a priori, including a defense of reliabilist responses to concerns with the coherence of the approach and its consistency with fallibilism and epistemological naturalism; and (5) a defense, on the basis of these critiques and the resulting stalemate between rationalism and empiricism, of the coherence of, and need for, empirical investigation into the existence of non-experiential sources of justification.

The next four, published after A Priori Justification (2005-2010), explore some of the above issues in more detail. These include an extension of the critique of traditional arguments by considering Mill's, Quine's, Putnam's and Kitcher's arguments against the existence of the a priori; a comparison of Casullo's favored minimal analysis of the a priori with Kitcher's indefeasibility analysis and a defense of the former against Kitcher's objections; and a more detailed examination of connections between the a priori and the necessary. Some other topics are discussed in these papers as well, such as the relationship between testimony and the a priori, and the relevance of socio-historical accounts of knowledge to the a priori.

The final four pieces are unpublished essays that address some issues in the recent literature. The first is an extension of critiques of skeptical arguments for the a priori (like theme 3 above), this time directed at George Bealer's attempt to argue that the "standard justificatory procedure" of relying on intuitions about cases in philosophical analysis cannot be accommodated by empiricism. The second and third essays raise problems for some recent accounts of modal knowledge or knowledge of the modal status of propositions (Williamson 2007 and Hill 2006). The final piece defends the a priori/a posteriori distinction from recent attempts to challenge its cogency and significance (Hawthorne 2007, Jenkins 2008, and Williamson 2007), arguing that these attacks all miss their target, and ending by pointing to a different challenge raised by reflection on entitlement theories: that perhaps some warrant or justification is neither a priori nor a posteriori.

While each of these papers is self-contained, together they constitute a careful and quite systematic treatment of a whole host of issues related to the a priori, with some of the latter essays developing the themes in the earlier papers. As might be expected from such a collection, there is some repetition of themes and arguments, but the repetition is modest and quite helpful where it occurs, and is always in the service of some further point not already dealt with in the other essays.

Casullo's essays are models of clarity and rigor. The arguments are so carefully laid out that it is difficult to resist agreeing with his conclusions. When it comes to the philosophical arguments for and against the a priori, arguments for rationalism and for empiricism, he succeeds again and again in showing that these are either too strong (if they apply to one camp, a parallel argument applies to the other) or too weak (if a response is available to one, a parallel response is available to the other).

However, Casullo's evaluation of BonJour's defense of rationalism seems shaky in comparison. BonJour's skeptical argument for rationalism is relatively straightforward. Consider any belief or judgment that q that is inferentially justified on the basis of some other belief that p. In order to be justified in believing q by inference from p, it is necessary (i) that one have good reasons for believing p and (ii) that one have good reasons for thinking that if p then q (or if p then probably q). But since experience can offer no direct support for the latter condition, any justification for it must be (wholly or partly) a priori. The rejection of the a priori thus leads to a very radical skepticism -- amounting, as BonJour puts it, to "intellectual suicide" (1998, 5). If rationalism does not have this radically skeptical consequence, then we have a good, indirect argument for rationalism.

BonJour's argument here relies on a strong internalist constraint -- condition (ii) above -- that we can call "inferential internalism" (Casullo calls it "meta-internalism"). One option for the empiricist is to reject (ii). BonJour has argued against externalism on the grounds that it leads to skepticism and that it conflicts with our intuitions about cases. Casullo provides strong responses on behalf of externalism (in the fourth and fifth essays). However, even if these are adequate, it is undeniable that there is an intuitive and traditionally prominent sense (even if not the only sense) in which inferential beliefs could be justified or rational only if one be aware in some way of reasons for one's beliefs, and aware of the relevance of those reasons to the truth of the beliefs. To deny that we have such reasons does seem to be "a very strong and implausible version of skepticism" (BonJour 1998, 96). In any case, I will focus here on internalist versions of empiricism -- and in particular, internalist versions that accept the inferential internalist clause (ii), and not just (i).

More narrowly still, I will focus on empiricist and rationalist versions of internalist foundationalism. Casullo argues persuasively that if coherentism is vulnerable to the objections raised by BonJour (1998), parallel objections apply to the rationalist. (See 94ff.) However, there is a different problem that seems to undermine internalist coherentism. The problem, in a nutshell, is that if the coherentist accepts the requirement that the subject have internal cognitive access to one's coherent belief set, that access will have to take the form of meta-beliefs to the effect that one has such-and-such beliefs -- meta-beliefs that would themselves have to be justified. And since the subject must have cognitive access to these further beliefs as well, the subject must have still other meta-beliefs that need to be justified, and so on, with the result that access to any of one's reasons turns out to be impossible.[1]

The rationalist might argue against the foundationalist empiricist as follows: A direct grasp or apprehension of abstract entities -- including general properties and logical relations -- allows for the justification of general truths, including general principles of inference. Experience, in contrast, is limited to particulars or property instances. But no cognitive state can, on its own, directly justify a belief whose content goes well beyond that of the state. So, no experience can, on its own, directly justify a belief in general truths or general principles. Casullo calls this the "generality argument" in support of the claim that experiences cannot provide direct justification for general principles (91).

We seem, then, to have a good reason to favor rationalism over internalist versions of empiricism. How would Casullo respond? First, although he is not explicit about this, one of the early essays (the second) seems to support the claim that one could justify general principles by induction[2] from a number of experiences. If successful, this would show that the foundationalist empiricist is not vulnerable to the skeptical problem. Second, Casullo argues that the rationalist cannot claim to have an advantage over the empiricist with respect to avoiding skepticism in the absence of a "non-metaphorical account" of our "apprehension" or "grasp" of properties (of the appropriate sort). Let us discuss each of these in turn.

Casullo provides a sketch of an empiricist account of the justification of mathematical beliefs by induction in his second essay. "The primary argument of the inductivist is that appeals to either a priori sources of justification or holistic considerations are unnecessary for the justification of elementary mathematical propositions in light of the available inductive support" (12-13). Consider, for example, an attempt to justify 2+2=4. Confirming instances of this generality might involve counting a collection of two objects, and another two objects, and then counting members of both groups and finding them to be four in number.

As Casullo notes, the instances support the generality only if certain background assumptions are in place: the objects do not disintegrate or multiply in between counting, and that counting does not itself lead to a change in the number of objects presented. What justifies the background assumptions? It obviously won't do to count a group of objects over time and find the result arrived at to be equal. This obviously depends on counting, and on mathematical or logical claims to the effect that some quantities are equal or unequal to others. The worry is twofold: the justification of some elementary mathematical claims will have to rely upon claims which are not themselves justified via induction; and the background assumption that objects are stable, etc., can only be justified by assuming that the background assumption is already true.

If we say that the background assumption is justified holistically or by its coherence with other mathematical beliefs, then this is no longer a purely inductivist justification of elementary mathematical propositions. Perhaps Casullo would respond by relying on the notion of entitlement or something like it: "Typically, one need not amass evidence in favor of each assumption prior to being justified in accepting the generalization unless there is some reason to believe that they are false" (15). But why should we accept this? What entitles us to rely on such assumptions here, where it would seem to be an ad hoc move on behalf of the inductivist? Unless more is said it seems that we lack any clear account of how the inductivist can account for the justification of elementary mathematical propositions.

Let us turn to Casullo's second objection:

Terms such as 'apprehension' and 'insight' suggest an analogy to perception. Perception, however, requires causal contact with the object perceived and properties cannot stand in causal relations. Rationalists maintain that the perceptual metaphor is misleading. But, in the absence of a non-metaphorical characterization, they are not in a position to state, let alone defend, the claim that we apprehend general features of objects. (92)

BonJour is sensitive to this concern, and attempts to address it by sketching an account of how thoughts can be about or have as part of their contents some particular properties"simply by virtue of their intrinsic, non-relational character" (1998, 180).

BonJour begins by noting that the account of intrinsic content "will have to involve metaphysics of a pretty hard-core kind," one that is "rare and unfashionable, even in this post-positivistic age" (1998, 181). In order for a thought to be about some property or have that property as part of its content, "the property in question must itself somehow be metaphysically involved in that character" (1998, 182). Of course, thoughts can be about properties without literally instantiating them; a thought about triangularity, for example, isn't itself triangular. BonJour suggests that the relevant universal -- e.g., triangularity -- need not be instantiated in the subject's mind, or indeed anywhere else, and nevertheless is a constituent of the thought, obviating any need to appeal to some further relation that the thought has to something else. Unfortunately, his sketch of the required account is rather schematic, involving the following "key claim" and some modest elaboration on it: "it is a necessary, quasi-logical fact that a thought instantiating a complex universal involving the universal triangularity in the appropriate way . . . is about triangular things" (cited in Casullo, 92, emphasis his; from BonJour 1998, 184).

We can make two critical observations at this point. First, as Casullo points out, BonJour does not provide an account of how a thought can have as its content some property; at best, he provides a sketch of an account of how a thought can have as its content particular objects or property instances, not properties. A second, related point is that it remains unclear how internal access is secured. BonJour himself admits that the fact that one is in a state that has some uninstantiated universal as a component "does not fully explain how I am thereby able to be conscious of the nature of that universal" (1998, 185). This underscores Casullo's worry that BonJour has not provided a non-metaphorical account of how subjects can "grasp" or "apprehend" properties.

If we can improve on BonJour's sketch of a rationalist account, we may be able to defend the skeptical argument for the indispensability of the a priori. And it seems that we can. In fact, a traditional Russellian view -- a view of the sort famously presented in The Problems of Philosophy (1912) -- is very much in the spirit of BonJour's and can provide what is needed. If this is right, then Casullo's dismissal of the dialectical argument for rationalism is too quick. This is not the place to develop and defend such an account, but a sketch consisting of a few core points should suffice to support the claim that the rationalist is not vulnerable to a parallel skeptical argument.

Let us begin with the second of the criticisms just discussed. The rationalist can say, as Russell once did, that we can have acquaintance with particulars and properties. This sounds metaphorical of course, but Russell used the term to stand for a relation of direct awareness: "we shall say that we have acquaintance with anything of which we are directly aware, without the intermediary of any process of inference or any knowledge of truths" (1912, Ch. 5). For Russell and most other acquaintance theorists, this relation of awareness is a primitive, a simple or unanalyzable concept. In the present context, it may seem ad hoc to appeal to a primitive concept to block the charge that appealing to apprehension or grasp of properties is metaphorical. But there's an intuitive, pre-theoretical sense in which we are directly aware of or conscious of what it is we are thinking about, and the acquaintance theory can be understood as making some additional theoretical claims about the nature of that awareness, its possible objects, and its epistemic significance.

On a Russellian view, though the underlying awareness is primitive, we can add that (i) it is a direct form of awareness: an awareness of X which does not depend essentially on awareness of something else; (ii) it is a non-intentional form of awareness: acquaintance with something does not consist in forming any judgment or thought about it, or applying any concepts to it; and (iii) it is a real relation requiring the existence of its relata -- one cannot be acquainted with some thing, property or fact that does not exist. (BonJour seems to accept at least the first two conditions.) There seems to be no incoherence in the idea of a form of awareness satisfying the above conditions. There is a long tradition of appealing to acquaintance or direct awareness, and the fact that the concept of direct awareness is treated as a primitive does not imply that there is no way to refer to it, that it cannot be characterized negatively and positively in some ways and defended on phenomenological and theoretical grounds. If this does not count as an "account" in Casullo's sense, we should question why an "account" is required before proceeding here but not, for example, when it comes to the concept of experience. The view can be understood as a form ofinternalism since it requires acquaintance with the relevant properties, relations, or facts that can serve as reasons or evidence in support of one's beliefs and inferences. There is no need to require, in addition, that the ordinary subject understand or accept an account of acquaintance and its epistemic significance in order to be justified.

Let us turn back to the first criticism of BonJour's view. BonJour could clarify, as Russell surely would, that any thought that predicates triangularity to a subject has the propertytriangularity as part of its content and so is in this sense "about" triangularity. If the question is how a thought can be "about" triangularity itself in the sense that the property, as opposed to something exemplifying the property, figures as the thought's subject, that depends on other elements of the same thought (demonstrative and other indexical elements, and quantifiers) and on how the universal triangularity is related to these other elements. A developed account would of course have to qualify this and make this more precise, but something like it is a natural way for an acquaintance theorist to proceed, and it's not clear why we should expect the rationalist to encounter any more difficulty than the empiricist in developing an account that makes good sense of demonstrative and other indexical concepts, quantification and predication, etc.

But what on this view distinguishes the a posteriori from the a priori? The Russellian has a straightforward suggestion. The distinction between a priori and a posteriori justification has to do with what one is aware of rather than with one's awareness of it; on the nature of one's evidence and not one's access to it. A subject has a posteriori justification if her justification depends essentially on an awareness of particulars or property instances. The belief that triangles exist, for example, might be justified by awareness of particular triangles or instances of triangularity. A subject has a priori justification if her justification or evidence for the belief does not depend essentially on awareness of any particulars, but on awareness only of universals, including complex universals. For example, direct awareness of an abstract logical relation of exclusion or incompatibility between the property of being triangular and the property of being circular can provide justification for believing that no triangles are circular, and justification for the inference from the belief that something is a triangle to its not being a circle.

Casullo might respond that it is open to the empiricist to say something similar: that experiences can provide justification for general principles (99). But what are these experiencesof? On the one hand, if we have experiences only of particulars then it is difficult to see how they can be a direct source of internalist justification for a general principle or general proposition, for it seems obvious that an experience of particulars provides by itself no evidence or reason for the subject to believe in general principles. On the other hand, if one adopts the view that one can experience abstract logical relations between universals, it would be exceedingly odd to call that an empiricist view -- just as it would be odd to call Russell an empiricist because he took the relation of acquaintance or direct awareness underlying all observational and sensory knowledge to be the same as that which underlies all mathematical and logical knowledge.

I have raised some concerns with Casullo's critique of BonJour's skeptical argument. My criticism is, however, modest in a number of ways. First, Casullo's critique of BonJour'ssketch of an account is on relatively solid ground -- though, as just discussed, there seem to be relatively straightforward ways to flesh out the account along Russellian lines thatCasullo does not consider. Second, the Russellian account I discuss is a rather unpopular one, even (to use BonJour's terms) in this post-positivistic age. Third, Casullo's haste here is uncharacteristic, for time and time again, he anticipates and examines with care the sorts of objections and follow-ups that are likely to be raised by rival views or likely to come up in his readers' minds.

Moreover, even if these criticisms are correct, this does not affect my assessment of the collection as a first-rate book. It is an accessible collection that no serious student or scholar of the rationalist-empiricist debate or the nature of a priori knowledge and justification can afford to ignore.


Bealer, G. 1992. "The Incoherence of Empiricism." Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, sup., 66: 99-138.

BonJour, L. 1998. In Defense of Pure Reason. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

BonJour, L. 2003. "A Version of Internalist Foundationalism." In L. BonJour and E. Sosa, Epistemic Justification: Internalism vs. Externalism, Foundations vs. Virtues. Malden, MA: Blackwell.

Casullo, A. 2003. A Priori Justification. New York: Oxford University Press.

Hawthorne, J. 2007. "A Priority and Externalism." In Internalism and Externalism in Semantics and Epistemology, ed. S. Goldberg. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Hill, C. 2006. "Modality, Modal Epistemology, and the Metaphysics of Consciousness." In The Architecture of the Imagination, ed. S. Nichols. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Jenkins, C. S. 2008. Grounding Concepts. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Russell, B. 1912. The Problems of Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Williamson, T. 2007. The Philosophy of Philosophy. Oxford: Blackwell.

[1] See Moser (1989) or BonJour (2003) for elaboration. The coherentist might avoid the problem by giving up the requirement of access to one's reasons, perhaps replacing it by a "mentalist" form of internalism that requires only that one's justifiers be mental items, or that one's justification supervene on the mental.

[2] The rationalist might raise worries here about how induction itself could be justified on a purely empiricist view. But let us set this thorny issue aside, as one might claim that the problem of induction is no less serious for the rationalist.