Essays on Deleuze

Placeholder book cover

Daniel W. Smith, Essays on Deleuze, Edinburgh University Press, 2012, 466pp., $40.00(pbk), ISBN 9780748643325.

Reviewed by Keith Ansell-Pearson, University of Warwick


What Williams James said of Bergson can, I think, be applied to Deleuze: his ideas are so profuse that many of them baffle his readers completely. Perhaps no one, at least in the English-speaking world, has done more to illuminate Deleuze's philosophical inventiveness than Daniel Smith.

Smith is well known as a translator of, and commentator on, European philosophy, especially the work of Deleuze. This volume is his first proper book and brings together twenty essays, the earliest from 1996 and the latest written especially for the volume. The coverage of Deleuze is wide-ranging and there is little of the extraordinary corpus Smith does not cover, with essays on aesthetics, ethics, politics, ontology, and contemporary philosophy. The volume is helpfully, if a little artificially, divided into four main parts, covering in turn Deleuze and the history of philosophy (with essays on Platonism, Leibniz, Hegel, pre- and post-Kantianism); Deleuze's philosophical system (with essays on Deleuze's thinking on sensation, on the theory of immanent Ideas, on the becoming of concepts, and on questions of ethics and immanence), key Deleuzian concepts (with essays on desire, life, the new, and the open), and, finally, Deleuze and contemporary philosophy (with essays on Derrida, Badiou, Lacan, Klossowski, and Paul Patton).

The volume begins with two especially helpful essays from 2005 and 2001, discussing, respectively, the questions: what does Deleuze intend exactly in his appropriation of the Nietzschean-inspired task of overturning Platonism? and why the stress in Deleuze's work on the thesis concerning the univocity of being?

Here, straightaway, we see the remarkable gifts Smith has as a reader of, and commentator on, Deleuze. He pursues both topics diligently and rigorously, yielding in the process a set of productive insights that serve to clarify the difficulties and densities of Deleuze's texts and positions. As Smith emphasizes in the essay on the overturning of Platonism, Deleuze is always seeking to innovate as a philosopher, for example, replacing established questions, such as 'what is x?', with new and thought-provoking ones, such as 'which one wills x?' Deleuze saw himself as a pluralist and empiricist, and sought to develop and advance a typology of forces. He located resources for such a project in thinkers as diverse as Bergson, Nietzsche, and Spinoza. Deleuze's Nietzsche et la philosophie, first published in France in 1962 and translated into English twenty-one years later, offered an extraordinary invention of the question of Nietzsche 'and' philosophy. In the English-speaking world it was many people's introduction to Deleuze. Along with Heidegger's monumental reading, Deleuze's made it possible to read Nietzsche as a philosopher, as opposed to a mere stylist or cultural critic. And unlike Heidegger's Nietzsche, Deleuze's was not a Vollendung (completion) of metaphysics or a point of exhaustion. Here was a Nietzsche who offered a new image of thought, a new notion of critique, even a new politics. What was surprising at the time, and surprises still, was the way Deleuze produced a systematic and coherent Nietzsche. But as Smith points out, Deleuze was very much wedded to the idea of philosophy as system, holding that the system should not simply be in perpetual heterogeneity, but that it should also be a heterogenesis, and he doubted whether that had ever been attempted.

For Deleuze univocity is the keystone of the entire philosophy of Spinoza even though, one may note, the word never appears in Spinoza's texts. In the essay on univocity Smith both explains Deleuze's fascination with Spinoza and the thesis on univocity, but also seeks to bring Deleuze's thinking on ontology into rapport with Heidegger and his questioning of the philosophical tradition as one of onto-theology. Heidegger wrote virtually nothing on Spinoza (the same is true of Derrida), an omission that is odd since, as Smith notes, the Ethics is a work of pure ontology and one that clearly stages the problem of the ontological difference in terms of a difference between Being (infinite substance) and beings (finite modes). As Smith explains, although for Spinoza we know only two of the infinite attributes of God (thought and extension), these attributes are common forms that can be predicated univocally of both God and his creatures:

Though formally distinct, the attributes are ontologically univocal. To say that the attributes are univocal means, for example, that it is in the same form that bodies imply extension, and that extension is an attribute of the divine substance (the position of immanence). If Spinoza radically rejects the notions of eminence, equivocity, and even analogy, it is because they imply that God possesses these perfections in a form different from that implied in his creatures, a "higher" form (the position of transcendence) (p. 31).

Smith does an equally helpful job in illuminating the univocity of cause for Deleuze, explaining clearly and concisely the difference between a transitive cause, an emanative cause, and an immanent cause. But the most important insight is that for Deleuze Being is equal in itself, being equally and immediately present in all beings and without mediation or an intermediary.

In illuminating such a core topic in Deleuze, Smith shows one of his great merits, namely his extensive and impressive grasp of the history of philosophy, including the ancients and the moderns. This grasp is in evidence in many of the essays collected in this volume and his range is impressive, with informed references to Plato, Duns Scotus, Leibniz, Spinoza, Kant, Heidegger, and so on.

Sometimes he is reliant on others for original insights, such as Graham Parkes on Nietzsche, and sometimes he fails to sufficiently probe a problem in an independent manner -- again, one of the examples I can think of is his usage of Nietzsche's Nachlass remark on overturning Platonism. Nietzsche refers to the goal as one of 'Living in Schein' (semblance or illusion), but precisely what this means, and what its connection might be with Deleuze's emphasis on the problem of simulacra, Smith does not adequately explore. What it means to overturn Platonism is deeply embedded in Nietzsche's thinking about what philosophy is and about overturning the moment of Socrates as a moment in the history of philosophy. Socrates, or the moment of Platonism, represents for Nietzsche an extreme moment within philosophy's development, one motivated by a pure but dangerous knowledge-drive; it is a moment he contrasts unfavourably with what he sees as the more important moment of Empedocles. Empedocles is a boundary-line figure for Nietzsche, hovering between poet and rhetorician, between god and man, between scientific man and artist, between statesman and priest, and between Pythagoras and Democritus. He is the motliest figure of ancient philosophy since he demarcates the age of myth, tragedy, and orgiastics and yet there appears in him at the same time a new Greek: democratic statesman, orator, figure of enlightenment, allegorist, and scientific human being. Smith does not bring out this aspect of 'overturning Platonism', and he does not attend to the extent to which Deleuze might be ignoring key facets of Nietzsche's project.

Two essays in particular serve to highlight the political dimension of Deleuze's philosophy and indeed how Deleuzian conceptual practice can radically transform political philosophy. These are the essay, 'Politics' ('Flow, Code, and Stock: A Note on Deleuze's Political Philosophy'), and one on Paul Patton's innovative work that seeks to effect a rapport between Deleuze and liberal political philosophy. As Smith points out, following Patton, Deleuze largely ignores the political concepts of the liberal tradition, such as the social contract and rights, because they take as ontologically given the existence of fully-formed or already constituted individuals as political subjects and thus ignore the importance of pre-subjective processes. As Smith puts it:

The political philosophy developed in Capitalism and Schizophrenia attempts to analyse social formations primarily as physical systems defined in terms of their 'processes', or rather a generalized theory of 'flows', such as flows of matter, of population, of commodities, of knowledge, and so on, and Deleuze is a philosopher, then, not of the primacy of the subject but of pre-subjective processes and flows (p. 342).

In this respect Deleuze is similar to Foucault and part of the same French tradition of thought that profoundly breaks with a philosophy of the foundational subject. However, according to Patton, as Smith draws out his argument, Deleuze differs from Foucault in his approach to power in that it can be said to be explicitly normative. Here the key (normative) concept is 'deterritorialization' since it provides a normative framework in which to evaluate processes. As Smith notes, to subject a social formation to analysis for Deleuze is to, 'unravel the variable lines and singular processes that constitute it as a multiplicity', such as connections, disjunctions, circuits, and possible transformations (p. 346). What must be avoided at all costs on this model is the reintroduction of universals -- such as universal rights or a universal reason -- that would stop the movement of these processes and make them affairs of transcendence. So, the argument goes, Deleuze has a notion of normativity but it is always to be used in the context of an appreciation of immanent processes.

But there is an interesting critical component to Deleuze's thinking: what needs to be always normative is the ability to critique and change existing norms so as to create something new, and Deleuze's theory ingeniously allows for this by granting a paramount role to the lines of flight and resistance that characterise a given assemblage. Far from being an ethical nihilist -- a charge frequently levelled at post-war French philosophy, but lazily, I would argue -- Deleuze wants to replace talk of universal rights, such as the rights of man, with the invention of jurisprudences that can respect the specificity of singular cases and events. It is when Deleuzian concepts are applied, such as here in the domain of politics and of core issues in normative political philosophy, that one can readily see the highly innovative character of Deleuze's thinking. It is a mode of thinking that calls for fundamental shifts in how we conceive ourselves as subjects and agents since we are implicated in the movement of 'machinic' processes and flows, to an extent that a philosophy of the foundational subject is unable to entertain and adequately conceptualise.

There is an aspect of Nietzsche's thinking Deleuze always remained wedded to, which is the idea that philosophy involves not only the creation of concepts -- the keystone of Deleuze's mature project -- but equally the invention of possibilities of life. For Nietzsche, the most powerful and fruitful era for thinkers of ancient Greece is the time before and during the Persian wars. This is the period when these possibilities of life are discovered, a time when philosophers appear who do not resemble scrawny desert hermits, theologizing counterfeiters, or depressed and pale scholars. Philosophers are outsiders to ordinary people and outsiders to each other (Nietzsche calls them 'abnormalities'). Nevertheless, their importance is to show us that there are possibilities of life. Nietzsche regards it as the task of history to preserve the memory of this. He intends to emphasize those points of each philosopher's system that constitutes a slice of personality. Nietzsche holds that what should interest us about a refuted system is the personal element, since this is irrefutable. What he seems to mean by this is a singular vision and dedication to a new way of looking at the world and creating a new perspective on it. As he memorably puts it: 'Each one of these philosophers simply saw the world come into being!'

Deleuze took great inspiration from Nietzsche's characterization of philosophy, and he is perhaps his rightful heir in the way he fashioned new concepts and opened up new possibilities of life for us late moderns. There is something remarkably fresh and vital about Deleuze as a philosopher -- he was not impressed by declarations of the end of philosophy or the death of metaphysics -- and Smith has a knack for bringing out this freshness and vitalism and showing its sheer range.

In this volume, then, Smith greatly illuminates both Deleuze's relation to the history of philosophy, including pre- and post-Kant, and some of Deleuze's most important and seminal, if extremely difficult texts, such as Difference and Repetition. There are fine essays on Deleuze as an ethicist that lucidly explain why for Deleuze desire is always positive and his is never simply the 'lack' model of desire that has informed the tradition of Western philosophy from Plato onwards. There are equally illuminating essays on Deleuze's relation to rival figures in contemporary French philosophy, such as Badiou and Derrida. Smith's is a singular voice and so many of the readings on display here are exemplary in their clarity and precision.

I personally would have liked more probing of Deleuze's commitment to pluralism, and to a certain pragmatism (Deleuze has an interesting relation to American philosophy that merits more attention than it receives), as well as of his peculiar kind of empiricism, such as a 'superior empiricism' and an 'empiricism of concepts'. In addition, there is a need for serious work that explores and illuminates Deleuze's ill-understood relation to phenomenology, be it in its classical form (Husserl) or its more innovative form (e.g., the work of Merleau-Ponty), but there is little on this in the volume. But criticisms of this kind are churlish. This is a delightfully rich volume of essays: the essays are uniformly excellent (I cannot find a dud essay in the volume) and one must conclude by saluting a superb achievement with this volume, namely, that of showing consistently over a number of years Deleuze's philosophical brilliance and illuminating this brilliance so instructively and imaginatively for so many readers.