Essays on Descartes

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Paul Hoffman, Essays on Descartes, Oxford UP, 2009, 282pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195321104.

Reviewed by Amy M. Schmitter, University of Alberta



Paul Hoffman’s collection Essays on Descartes comes in a plain, not-quite-brown wrapper that camouflages the trailblazing work within. Hoffman is among the very first of recent Anglophone commentators to examine Descartes’s anthropology (by which I mean his account of the full, embodied human being, not his fieldwork among exotic peoples). This book gathers together fourteen essays, all but two of which have been published previously, including such important works as “The Unity of Descartes’s Man” and an abridged version of “Three Dualist Theories of the Passions”. The essays are mostly unrevised, but the volume adds a helpful introduction and some new notes, many of which serve to cross-index views Hoffman has developed and refined over the last quarter-century. The essays cover a wide array of topics, including metaphysics, cognitive and moral psychology, and causation. Of course, not everything can be considered: the reader will find scant mention of Descartes’s skepticism here, little on textbook concerns of epistemology or science, and nothing on method or mathematics, with the result that some works of Descartes come in for little discussion. Eschewing these time-worn subjects allows Hoffman to address with great thoroughness issues equally close to Descartes’s heart but much less familiar to general audiences today.

Hoffman’s work is informed by three commitments he claims Descartes inherits from his broadly Aristotelian background: a hylomorphic account of the unity of mind and body, a view of causation that identifies an action in the agent with a passion in the recipient, and an “incorporation” approach to cognition that requires some sort of identity between soul and object cognized. On this basis, Hoffman groups his essays into four parts devoted to hylomorphism and the theory of distinctions, to causation, to cognition, and in a final section, to moral psychology. But the three Aristotelian themes Hoffman pinpoints appear throughout the collection. For instance, the first essay, “The Unity of Descartes’s Man” (a good place for those new to Hoffman’s work to start), advances an account of the human being as a composite substance, an ens per se, in which mind and body are united as form to matter; part of what explains their union is the identity of action and passion whereby an action of the body can simultaneously be a passion of the mind. Many essays develop questions and arguments introduced in earlier essays: the subject of the unity of the human being leads to further discussion of the ontology of distinctions (real, modal and rational) and of straddling modes (modes that are modes simultaneously of two substances), as well as to consideration of the nature of composite entities. Likewise, the treatment of the identity of action and passion in causation underlies many of the arguments about cognitive representation in the third part. Many of Hoffman’s themes come together in the last section on moral psychology, which focuses on the passions and the will, and particularly considers the nature of the passions and their consequences for both strength of will and freedom. The discussion of freedom and the remedies for the passions ends on a grace note with Descartes’s lovely notion of the passion-cum-virtue of generosité (cognate with, but not really translatable as ‘generosity’).

Some Descartes scholars may find that Hoffman overstates some of his characteristic claims. But since stubborn stereotypes of the implications of Cartesian dualism persist, a certain amount of rhetorical exaggeration may be understandable, even advisable. The first essay is a useful reminder of the state of scholarly affairs prevailing in 1986, when even Margaret Wilson’s groundbreaking book Descartes reduced the issue of the union of mind and body largely to the causal interaction between thinking and extended modes. Today, Hoffman’s position that the union is hylomorphic is accepted by many, though hardly all. Still, his narrow focus on the question of union, and his emphasis on hylomorphism, may downplay Descartes’s break with his predecessors. For Descartes introduces the doctrine as part of his diagnosis and rejection of the appealing but mistaken Scholastic move of projecting a mind-like ontology generally onto mere matter, a view prominent in his letters as an explanation of why the gravity of heavy things had been considered a real quality, or substantial form.1 Although Hoffman acknowledges this context, he insists on the broadly Aristotelian provenance of Descartes’s thought so emphatically that an unwary reader might be surprised by the extent of Descartes’s quarrel with the schools. For this reason, Hoffman’s analyses are more convincing when they situate Descartes’s views within the often clamorous debates of later Scholastics, from Ockham to Suarez and beyond.

Since part of the duty of a reviewer is to acknowledge aspects of a work that give her pause, I will do so further in what follows. But let me underscore that many are simply matters of interpretive emphasis or omission that in no way lessen the interest of the questions Hoffman raises, or his ingenuity in addressing them. That is the case even when the conclusion might be overstated. For instance, Hoffman does a real service in drawing attention to the Cartesian notion of the freedom of spontaneity, although I am puzzled by the suggestion that it shows that Descartes reductively identifies our essence with reason (pp. 199-200), especially since Hoffman acknowledges the value of our passionate dispositions to the full human being (p. 236).

Consider also the case made by “Cartesian Passions and Cartesian Dualism” for “straddling modes”, particularly for counting the soul’s perceptions, or passions (in a broad sense), and the body’s actions, or movements, as a single mode attributable to the substantial individual arising from the union of mind and body. Hoffman takes his cue from the opening articles of the Passions of the Soul where Descartes declares that action and passion are the “same thing” [une même chose] related to “two different subjects”. Since Descartes’s ontology forbids counting that thing as a full-scale substance, Hoffman argues that there is only one alternative; by default, “it can be safely inferred that he thinks that action and passion are one and the same mode” (107). So Hoffman concludes that a mode of extension must be token-identical to a mode of mind. To avoid violating Descartes’s theory of distinctions, this single mode must be attributed to a true individual, the embodied human being. Hoffman does yeoman’s work in pushing through this argument (including analyzing Descartes’s very strange account of the ontology of transubstantiation), and is much more conscientious in considering alternatives than many other scholars who address similar issues. Still, it seems to me that he is a bit hasty in moving from the view that action and passion are “a same thing” to assuming that they obey the conditions of individuation carved out by Descartes’s official theory of distinctions, particularly if the move is based on the further assumption that action and passion are numerically identical in a strong sense.2 Descartes likewise states (in the Replies to the First Objections) that the idea of the sun is the sun itself [sit sole ipse] existing in the intellect — albeit not “formally” but “objectively” (AT VII 102). "Esse ipse" strikes me as every bit as strong as "une mesme chose", but I don’t think that Descartes thereby implies that the idea of the sun and the sun in the heavens are numerically identical. Indeed, Hoffman denies that saying that the same thing exists in two modes makes them identical, since doing so would run afoul of his account of how objective incorporation in cognition can allow for both representation and misrepresentation (p. 168). His reason for claiming numerical identity for the straddling mode is to avoid the problem of “migrating modes” — detachable modes that move from one substance to another (p. 110). He then must concede, however, that the mode has two “aspects”, a claim that deserves further accounting (p. 119).

There are other places where one might wonder whether Hoffman’s decision to interpret a key passage in one, albeit plausible, way doesn’t come at an overly high price. An example might serve: Hoffman takes it that Descartes holds that we can ameliorate our passionate dispositions through habituation, because doing so “can rewire, as it were, the connections between mind and body” (p. 5). But many of Hoffman’s examples of habituation found in the Passions of the Soul (p. 103) are ambiguous about just where the alteration occurs. Moreover, Descartes gives an important role to the corporeal imagination, comparing it to what is involved in training dogs (§50). As such, we might understand habituation to work not by disrupting the “natural institutions” pairing proximate mental events and brain motions, but by reshaping the internal structure of our brains so that the downstream effects of our volitions and upstream effects of environmental inputs conform to our best-considered standards.3 This alternative seems both more philosophically economical, and more explanatory of how habituation works than Hoffman’s reading.

Sometimes, I would be grateful for a bit more explanation (and perhaps less demonstration) of the significance of various interpretive alternatives. For instance, Hoffman introduces his account of the Aristotelian understanding of causation that identifies action and passion through the model of lifting a vase, in contrast to the “Humean” conception of two, temporally distinct events, as in the case of one billiard ball striking another. These examples are suggestive, but I am unsure how to apply them in analyzing a range of cases important to Descartes’s physics and metaphysics. For there are surely cases where Descartes can — and does — talk about chains of causes and effects. Although the previously unpublished “Passion and Motion in the New Mechanics” considers Descartes’s notion of force within the general understanding of causation, I don’t find myself left with a good big-picture sense of what sort of mechanics would meet Hoffman’s understanding of Cartesian causation. And despite the detailed enumeration of competing accounts of representationalism and direct realism in “Direct Realism, Intentionality and the Objective Being of Ideas”, I am unsure what significance attaches to Hoffman’s attribution of a weak form of representationalism to Descartes and Aquinas — and whether there is any plausible conception of a non-representationalist alternative. Hoffman often relies heavily on particular key passages for his interpretive compass, and while he tenaciously pursues their implications for other parts of Descartes’s work, he rarely revisits the initial readings. As a result, we don’t get the sort of back-and-forth, dialectical modifications that can provide real hermeneutical insight. More troubling is that Hoffman sometimes neglects the context of the passages on which he leans. For instance, he refers to the statement in the Replies to the First Objections that the idea of the sun is the sun itself existing in the intellect as a “clear endorsement of Thomistic theory” (p. 167). But the language there comes from the objector, Caterus, and Descartes often adopts his interlocutors’ dialects, without thereby taking on their commitments.

Let me reiterate that my criticisms are simply the typical picking of bones for which scholars are notorious. Other Descartes scholars will enjoy finding other points of contention, while general philosophical audiences should find Hoffman’s collection valuable for introducing them to a range of extremely interesting (and perhaps unexpected) issues. But I think the work would have benefitted from being shaped into a single, continuous book. Most of the essays are already available, at least in major academic libraries, and are only lightly revised here. Further reworking might have caught some careless proofreading (readers should note that the unabridged version of “Three Dualist Theories of the Passions” does not discuss Leibniz, but Malebranche). There is also a fair amount of repetition — perfectly understandable in light of the essays’ publication history, but somewhat tedious to encounter in one setting. Incorporating the essays into a single work would have allowed some of the redundant passages (including citations) to be eliminated in favor of further development of the overall account. The collection does, in fact, show more thematic coherence than such collections often do, and since Hoffman’s approach is distinctive and intriguing, it deserves to be fully developed.

Nonetheless, as anybody who has ever taught a class knows, repetition is often useful. And scholarly philosophy books are rarely read straight through like novels. Essays on Descartes is well-suited both for grazing and for focused forays into specific issues, and for that reason, it is a good thing that the essays can be read independently of each other. I hope the collection will get an audience beyond students and scholars of Descartes, if only to give the lie to prevailing stereotypes of Cartesian dualism. One doesn’t have to agree with all of Hoffman’s claims (I don’t) to benefit from having familiar assumptions shaken up. One accommodating feature of this publication is that it is available in a Kindle edition; perhaps a convenient electronic download will be just the thing to tempt new readers to delve into particular parts.

1 This issue is discussed by Dan Garber, in Descartes’ Metaphysical Physics (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1992), Chapter Four; Garber also expresses something similar to Hoffman’s view on p. 99.

2 Deborah Brown analyzes the consequences of this assumption in detail in Chapter Five of Descartes and the Passionate Mind (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2006).

3 This gloss makes habituation a fine example of what Amèlie Rorty has called “thinking with the body”; see “Descartes on Thinking with the Body” in The Cambridge Companion to Descartes, ed. J. Cottingham (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992), 371-92.