Essence and Existence: Selected Essays

Essays On Essence And Existence

Bob Hale, Jessica Leech (ed.), Essence and Existence: Selected Essays, Oxford University Press, (2020), 305pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780198854296.

Reviewed by Sam Cowling, Denison University


Bob Hale passed away in 2017. This volume, edited by Jessica Leech, collects fifteen essays by Hale including three co-authored pieces, all of which were written after Hale’s 2013 book, Necessary Beings. (Nine of the essays are published elsewhere.) All but one of the essays are concerned with metaphysics or the philosophy of mathematics. Even so, the collection is without a unified theme and the papers range freely across topics such as essence, ontology, abstraction, truthmaking, modality, and analyticity. The fact that these papers follow the publication of Necessary Beings does a lot to explain their origin: most of them take up themes and open questions from Hale’s book, and the overall metaphysical picture remains unchanged. Thankfully, Hale is an exemplary tour guide when it comes to his brand of neo-Fregean essentialism. He never presupposes the reader’s familiarity with previous work, avoids needless self-reference, and is always eager to engage other philosophers in productive ways. The result is an impressive series of carefully crafted essays that usefully supplement Necessary Beings.

For those working in metaphysics, there should be a distinctive appeal to this volume. Philosophers of mathematics are sure to be familiar with the neo-Fregeanism jointly developed by Hale and Crispin Wright. But, despite sharing key concerns in ontology and modality, many “post-Quinean” metaphysicians, especially those of a Lewisian stripe, have afforded the neo-Fregean framework surprisingly little attention.[1] This limited attention is partly understandable: the presentation of the neo-Fregean ontology is often wedded to (or buried under) Hale and Wright’s attention to logical, mathematical, and semantic detail. But, despite its piecemeal orientation, this collection serves as a gentle introduction to the metaphysical elements of the neo-Fregean agenda. There’s a further source of potential interest for post-Quinean metaphysicians here as well: Hale’s sustained inquiry into Kit Fine’s views. Five of the essays included are directly concerned with Fine’s metaphysics, and several more engage his approaches to essence, truthmaking, and reality. Fine also contributes an introduction to this volume.

Despite their varied focus within metaphysics, these essays cluster around a few general themes. The first is Hale’s modalist essentialism. In “S5 as the Logic of Metaphysical Modality” and “Relative Necessity Reformulated” (with Jessica Leech), Hale defends his commitment to a primitive notion of metaphysical necessity—one that subsumes logical necessity—and sets out a modalist theoretical framework—one that rejects theoretical appeals to possible worlds. For Hale, modal facts are to be (non-reductively) explained in terms of the essences of things: “what is necessary is what is true in virtue of the natures or essences of things, and what is possible is what is not ruled out by the natures of things (i.e., what is not false in virtue of the nature of things)” (24). Importantly, Hale takes properties rather than individuals to play the central explanatory role in the metaphysics of modality, since it is the natures of necessarily existing properties that underwrite modal facts. (Hale treats haecceitistic modal facts regarding specific individuals through slightly different means.) This Fine-style essentialism is spelled out in “Essence and Definition by Abstraction” and “Essence and Existence.” In “The Problem of De Re Modality,” Hale revisits Quine’s influential case against de re modality as well as Fine’s own response to the Quinean arguments.

A second recurring theme is the metaphysics of abstraction and, in particular, the significance of Hume’s Principle, which is the linchpin of the neo-Fregean philosophy of mathematics. Hume’s Principle asserts that the number of Fs = the number of Gs if and only if there is a one-one correspondence between Fs and Gs. As Hale takes pains to note, the significance of Hume’s Principle is not due to facts regarding one-one correspondences somehow grounding or being more fundamental than facts about the identity of cardinal numbers. In characterizing the role of this and other abstraction principles, Hale says:

the intended effect is not to create new objects, nor . . . is it to expand the domain of first-order quantification to incorporate a range of independently existing objects which had hitherto lain outside it; rather, it is to disclose, by way of the introduction of a new concept, a range of objects already lying with the domain of quantification, but not previously identifiable or discernible, because the conceptual resources needed for their identification were lacking. (185)

The ontological import of abstraction principles and their connection to realism about properties receives careful attention throughout these essays, most notably in “Ontology Deflated” and “The Problem of Mathematical Objects.” In “Definition, Abstraction, Postulation, and Magic,” Hale examines Fine’s postulationist philosophy of mathematics with an eye toward clarifying how postulationism differs from neo-Fregeanism. In “Ordinals by Abstraction,” Hale explores competing abstraction principles for ordinal rather than cardinal numbers.

An additional theme of the book, which I’ll focus on in what follows, is the ontology of properties. Throughout these essays, Hale assumes what he calls a deflationist view of properties, which has three main components. The first of these is a commitment to an abundant rather than sparse conception of properties. For Hale, there is no significant ontological difference between properties like being an electron that figure into the laws of nature and gerrymandered properties like being a triangle or a salad that do not. Importantly, Hale’s development of the abundant conception over these essays is distinctive for the constraint he places on the stock of abundant properties. Where other abundant conceptions often take properties to be identical with (or aptly represented by) arbitrary sets of individuals, Hale’s abundantism requires properties to be definable in “some possible language or possible extension of some actual language” (225). Hale explores this semantically constrained abundantism in “Second-Order Logic: Properties, Semantics, and Existential Commitments” and “Properties, Predication, and Arbitrary Sets.”

The second component of Hale’s deflationism concernsnot which properties there are, but what it means for there to be properties in the first place. According to Hale, “all that is required for the existence of a purely general property . . . is that there could be a predicate associated with a suitable application or satisfaction condition” (37). Or, as he puts it elsewhere, “no more is required for the existence of any purely general property or relation than that there could be a predicate with the appropriate satisfaction condition” (19). Such a view stands in contrast with more familiar forms of realism, according to which there is a further metaphysical question about the existence of properties that can be posed even after we have accepted certain predicative claims as true. In this way, Hale’s deflationism rules out, arguably by fiat, any nominalist views: the case for realism about properties is closed once we grant that predicates have suitable application conditions.

The third component of Hale’s deflationary conception concerns not which properties there are or what is required for them exist, but what properties are like. Importantly, this component isn’t a positive thesis. It is a quietist attitude toward certain questions one might ask about properties. Are they tropes or universals? Do they have distinctive internal structures? Are they mereologically or non-mereologically composed? Are they located where instantiated? Throughout these essays, Hale’s deflationary conception is noteworthy for eschewing these debates, opting for a kind of quietism about the nature of properties. Although Hale mounts no direct case against the cogency of these metaphysical questions, the deflationist view is a bare-bones one, telling us little more than that properties are the semantic values of whatever predicates we might apply.

Hale’s deflationism isn’t without its appeal. Anyone who has dug deeply into the literature on the metaphysics of properties has surely felt the occasional temptation to dismiss the tropes-universals debate or, in a bout of frustration, consign the structural universals literature to the flames. But there are costs that come with Hale’s brand of deflationism, especially if we pursue large-scale metaphysical projects that deploy properties in our theoretical explanations. Here, I’ll consider a few issues with Hale’s deflationism that surface when weighing the overall view on offer.

A first (and surely the most amorphous) issue concerns the realist credentials of Hale’s account of properties. Despite Hale’s insistence to the contrary, his deflationism fits oddly with the implicit commitment of realism: that properties don’t exist in virtue of epistemic or linguistic practices. In defending his semantic constraint on properties, Hale denies that there are inexpressible or “arbitrary” properties. But inexpressible or arbitrary ways that things are (or could be) are nevertheless ways that things are (or could be). Hale’s semantic constraint specifically ensures that the ontology of properties cannot outstrip what is expressible. It is, in this way, quite unlike familiar forms of property realism that acknowledge our semantic resources might fall short of being able to express each and every property. Given this semantic constraint, the resulting deflationism has an unacknowledged affinity with the sort of conceptual idealism defended in Thomas Hofweber (2016) and elsewhere.

While questions about Hale’s deflationism and essentialism can be posed in isolation, their interaction and the prospects for the combined metaphysics of properties and modality are perhaps of the greatest interest. Each commitment carries with it a distinctive thesis of metaphysical dependence. Recall that, according to Hale’s essentialism, modal facts hold in virtue of the nature of properties. So, for example, the fact that necessarily tigers are mammals and the fact that tigers can swim each hold in virtue of the natures of properties like being a tiger. While some possible worlds theorists take modal facts to hold in virtue of possible worlds and their contents, Hale’s picture is one on which the modal structure of reality instead issues from the stock of abundant properties.

A different thesis of dependence emerges from his deflationist treatment of properties, according to which facts about the existence of properties hold in virtue of facts about what predicates could be suitably applied. We can call this modal-semantic property on which facts about the existence of properties depend being predicable.

In most cases, the metaphysical picture hangs together well enough. The property of being a horned tiger exists in virtue of a modal fact: that being a horned tiger is predicable. Given Hale’s essentialism, this modal fact holds in virtue of the nature of properties like being a horned tiger and being predicable. Consider, however, what happens when we inquire into the case of being predicable. If we ask what being predicable exists in virtue of, we are required to point to modal facts—namely, that being predicable is predicable. But, according to Hale’s essentialism, these modal facts must hold in virtue of the nature of properties and here the only plausible candidate property that might ground these facts is being predicable itself. It looks, therefore, like we encounter a case of circular grounding when we combine Hale’s essentialism and deflationism: facts about the nature of being predicable ground the modal facts in virtue of which being predicable exists.

There are hard lines Hale might draw here, perhaps by denying that his deflationist account of properties involves relations of genuine metaphysical dependence. Or perhaps being predicable warrants special pleading. But there’s another moral that’s tempting to draw: that a deflationist metaphysics of properties is unable to sustain the explanatory burden of Hale’s essentialism. To properly appreciate the radical ambitions of this proposal, consider the ideological and ontological costs other metaphysical views bear in their efforts to give an account of what grounds modal facts. While concrete possible worlds are a steep and rarely paid price, structural universals or world-sized maximal properties remain a hefty but familiar posit for many Platonists. In sharp contrast, if Hale’s view is correct, these views are all badly mistaken and paying far, far too much when making sense of modality. Hale asserts there is remarkably little to properties and their natures: they exist just in case certain predicates can be suitably deployed. Yet somehow, they have natures rich enough to account for all modal structure.

Although Hale’s modal metaphysics is explicitly non-reductive in its ambitions, a different line of argument also raises concerns about whether the deflationary conception of properties is suitable for underwriting modal facts. In On the Plurality of Worlds, David Lewis mounts a formidable case against what he calls “magical ersatzism,” which is a family of views that identify possible worlds with abstract entities like properties. The gist of Lewis’ concern takes the form of a dilemma. Roughly, such views either take on an implausible burden of manifold, inexplicable necessities holding among abstract entities (e.g., properties or propositions) or if an effort is made to explain these necessary connections, doing so requires positing a realm of abstract entities with rich and varied intrinsic natures. But, as Lewis argues, no account of our epistemic access to these natures seems plausible.

Importantly, this dilemma isn’t just a problem for possible worlds theorists. It can also be wielded against certain modalist views like Hale’s, which reject possible worlds but that rely on properties to explain modal notions. As should be obvious, Hale’s view has no patience for properties with rich intrinsic natures, so it is a view that embraces the first horn of Lewis’ dilemma by positing myriad necessary connections among abundant properties. And, while Hale might insist that his view is no worse off than other Platonist competitors, there’s a reason to suspect his view faces a more serious variant of this problem. This is due to Hale’s view about what is required for properties to exist: he is saddled not just with unexplained modal ties among properties, but also with unexplained necessary connections between properties and the predicates that possibly express them.

Recall that, for Hale, “all that is required for the actual existence of a purely general property is the possible existence of a suitable predicate” (192). Presented with such an account, we might reasonably ask why certain merely possible predicates guarantee the actual existence of properties. But we can also ask what explains why any specific predicate necessitates the actual existence of a specific property rather than necessitating the existence of some other property. Regardless of how we might answer these questions, Hale’s view posits a perfect modal concordance between actual properties and linguistic items—namely, possibly applied predicates. This concordance requires not just the myriad necessary connections among properties that come with familiar magical ersatzisms and their modalist relatives. It demands something weirder still: unexplained necessary connections between properties and predicates. This is a cost that abundantist views are best served to avoid.

Although I’ve raised a few concerns about Hale’s metaphysics of properties, the essays in this volume deserve careful consideration from anyone curious about Neo-Fregean metaphysics.


Thanks to Dan Giberman and Kelly Trogdon for helpful comments and discussion.


Eklund, M. 2016. “Hale and Wright on the Metaontology of Neo-Fregeanism.” Abstractionism, eds P. Ebert and M. Rossberg. Oxford: Oxford University Press. 79–93.

Hofweber, T. 2016. Ontology and the Ambitions of Metaphysics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

MacBride, F. 2003 “Speaking with Shadows: A Study of Neo-Logicism.” British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 54: 103–63.

Sider, T. 2007. “Neo-Fregeanism and Quantifier Variance.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 81: 201–32.

[1] There are important exceptions, of course; see Matti Eklund (2016) and Theodore Sider (2007). For a primer on neo-Fregeanism, see Fraser MacBride (2003).