Essays on Gödel's Reception of Leibniz, Husserl, and Brouwer

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Mark van Atten, Essays on Gödel's Reception of Leibniz, Husserl, and Brouwer, Springer, 2015, 327pp., $179.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319100302.

Reviewed by Jean Paul Van Bendegem, Vrije Universiteit Brussel, Center for Logic and Philosophy of Science


This book is a beautiful example of genuine Gödel scholarship by an author who is quite rightly recognized as an authority in the field, and thus it is an important contribution that cannot be ignored. It would, however, be wrong to state that therefore only Gödel scholars should take an interest in these essays. The scope of the collection is much broader than that in at least three ways.

First, a deep philosophical question is at the basis of the work presented in the book: what could constitute a philosophical or, at least, a philosophically motivated and/or justified foundation of mathematics? This goes well beyond stating that, e.g., ZFC (Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory with the axiom of choice) or category theory is a good (candidate for a) foundational theory of mathematics on the basis of the argument that major parts, if not every part, of what is today known as mathematics can be expressed in that theory. Here, in contrast, Mark van Atten raises questions that deal with the philosophical justifications and consequences of such a foundational theory. Hence any philosopher of mathematics, and indeed any philosopher, should be interested, as ontological and epistemological positions that ignore mathematics as a special domain or 'test-case' are essentially incomplete.

Second, anyone with a general background in philosophy of mathematics, when asked what Gödel's foundational-philosophical position was, will answer that he was a Platonist and that (mathematical) intuition was the preferred access to the perfect mathematical realm (very often quoting the famous passage in Gödel [1990], p. 268: "But, despite their remoteness from sense experience, we do have something like a perception also of the objects of set theory, as is seen from the fact that the axioms force themselves upon us as being true."). There is, however, much more to it than that. Is it not striking that Gödel paid so much attention to constructive mathematics, intuitionism and its founding father, L.E.J. Brouwer, in particular? Anyone interested in constructive mathematics can learn a lot from Gödel's thoughts on how to interpret concepts like 'finite', 'finitary' and 'finitist means' in such a way that they can cover a far greater part of mathematics than intuitionists such as Brouwer will allow for.

Third, perhaps more important, however, is the fact that the combination of Gödel on the one hand and Husserl on the other brings together two traditions that most philosophers usually think of as completely separate. Here we have logical empiricism (or positivism) -- and was Gödel not a regular visitor of the meetings of the Wiener Kreis? -- and there we have phenomenology. That both philosophical views have grown apart is hard to deny -- the reasons why is an entirely different matter (see Michael Friedman [2000] for a possible explanation) -- but to claim that they are entirely separate is quite a different thing. Was not Felix Kaufmann, a phenomenologist, a member of the Wiener Kreis? His essay on the elimination of the infinite in mathematics (see Kaufmann [1978]) is written from a Husserlian perspective. And have scholars such as Richard Tieszen (see Tieszen [2005]), Robert Tragesser (see Tragesser [1984]) and of course van Atten himself not shown that phenomenology has an obvious place in the foundations of mathematics?

Against the background of the above considerations van Atten's overall aim is to understand and evaluate Gödel's thinking in the later period of his life, roughly starting in 1959 up to his death in 1978. This can be summarized in terms of a two-fold 'grand' project:

1. Use Husserl's transcendental phenomenology to reconstruct and develop Leibniz' monadology into an axiomatic metaphysics.

2. Apply the metaphysics thus obtained to develop a Platonistic foundation for classical mathematics. (p. 2)

Note that Brouwer and intuitionism are not explicitly mentioned in this quote, but for van Atten it is clear that Brouwer is something of a missing link in the whole story. And, I may add, he is a reliable source in this context, for he is familiar not only with the work of Gödel itself but also with phenomenology (Husserl in particular) and intuitionism (witness his Ph.D. thesis, published as van Atten [1999]).

The book follows, more or less, this ambitious research program of Gödel. It is divided into four parts. The first three parts are what one might expect, part I on Gödel and Leibniz (three papers), part II on Gödel and Husserl (four papers), part III on Gödel and Brouwer (three papers) and part IV, entitled 'A Partial Assessment', consisting of a single paper 'Construction and Constitution in Mathematics'. As one might expect if familiar at all with the work of the later Gödel, the famous Dialectica paper (see Gödel [1990]) has a central part to play. It is here that the historical craftsmanship of van Atten becomes clear. He has spent quite some time in the Gödel archive, the Kurt Gödel Papers at Princeton University, and discusses several notes concerning and drafts of the Dialectica paper in full detail so that the reader can almost follow the genesis and various transformations of the text. Gödel was known for taking all the time he needed to write, often years, so there are many other versions of a finally published paper. But it is not 'merely' history and faithful and detailed reconstruction that interests van Atten; he also wants to make a philosophical evaluation. This applies first and foremost, though not exclusively, to the final chapter where he presents a partial assessment. That evaluation is not positive, for van Atten clearly argues that Gödel's two-fold project cannot succeed. On both counts! He has serious doubts about the Leibniz part of the project and therefore about the Husserlian approach to develop Leibniz's monadology into an axiomatic metaphysics, and he questions whether such an approach could lead to a justification of Platonism. Rather he argues for the position that Brouwer's notion of the construction of mathematical objects coincides with the constitution of those objects by the transcendental subject in Husserl's sense. In short, it seems that not Platonism but constructivism is better supported by a phenomenological analysis. A conclusion worth thinking about!

As I said above, the book follows more or less the development of Gödel's thoughts and writings between 1959 and 1978. It is after all a collection of essays that had been published previously in various places over a period of almost fifteen years. It suffers from the major drawbacks of such a collection: a certain lack of coherence and a danger of repetition (and, to be clear about this, both are acknowledged and regretted by van Atten in the introduction). It is, e.g., a bit odd to see a reference to a paper of his listed as forthcoming (p. 190) and then find that that paper is in the book itself. Repetition, too, is very hard to avoid. In chapter 4 ('Gödel's Dialectica Interpretation and Leibniz') and chapter 11 ('Gödel and Intuitionism'), a detailed analysis is presented of manuscripts that would lead up to the Dialectica paper, so a certain overlap is unavoidable. A single integrated treatment of these materials would have been a greater gift to the reader. Given these constraints, it is fair to say that van Atten has really made an effort to create an overall coherent framework and to find a balance between a faithful and annotated reproduction of the original papers (as academic standards require) and an internal continuity and coherence among them.

There are some elements in the book that compensate for the drawbacks, including a full bibliography as well as author and subject indexes, which are extremely useful. Rather intriguingly, van Atten himself selects four papers as the core of the book -- which suggests that the other seven papers are of less importance -- so that the reader who, for whatever reasons, does not want to go through the whole book can limit him-or-herself to:

(i) 'Monads and sets: On Gödel, Leibniz, and the Reflection Principle' (chapter 3 in part I),

(ii) 'On the Philosophical Development of Kurt Gödel' (jointly written with Juliette Kennedy) (chapter 6 in part II),

(iii) 'Gödel and Intuitionism' (chapter 11 in part III), and

(iv) the already mentioned 'Construction and Constitution in Mathematics' (chapter 12 in part IV).

This makes absolute sense: one paper on Gödel and Leibniz, one on Gödel and Husserl, one on Gödel and Brouwer and a final chapter for the evaluation. So what about the seven remaining papers? I have to confess that I was a bit puzzled by chapter 9 ('Gödel and Brouwer: Two Rivalling Brothers', the opening of part III). This is a short paper that appeared originally in French in Pour la Science (the French counterpart of Scientific American). Although it is a very nice presentation, it addresses a larger, non-specialist audience than do the other papers, which are clearly meant for the academic, mathematical and philosophical communities. Then there is chapter 10, 'Mysticism and Mathematics: Brouwer, Gödel, and the Common Core Thesis', which perhaps does not easily fit in with the rest of the book but is nevertheless very interesting. It would be a great pity if that chapter were to be ignored because of a focus on the four core chapters. Roughly stated, the common core thesis is that all forms of mysticism are at the core alike but their appearances can (and do) differ. Van Atten, however, claims the opposite: Brouwer's mysticism is not to be confused with Gödel's mysticism. In his own words: "For Gödel, doing mathematics is a way of accessing the Absolute. For Brouwer, doing mathematics precisely prohibits access to the Absolute" (p. 182). It reminded me of Henk Barendregt's view in van Atten (indeed!) et al. [2008], where he proposes a dual core thesis instead of a common core thesis to understand Gödel's and Brouwer's views but on different grounds. For him the distinction is not based on a relation with the Absolute but more on differences in practices: "that of bliss and ecstasy of the concentration meditation and that of permanent purification through insight meditation" (p. 142). This invites further reflection as a research topic on its own.

In summary, one can only hope that in the near future van Atten will integrate all of his work up to this point (this collection does not bring together all of his publications on these topics, there is more to explore) into a book-length treatise on the development of Gödel's post-1959 thinking and writing in relation to his intellectual fellow travelers, friends and enemies alike.


Barendregt, Henk [2008]: "Buddhist models of the mind and the common core thesis on mysticism", in Mark van Atten, Pascal Boldini, Michel Bourdeau and Gerhard Heinzmann (eds.), One Hundred Years of Intuitionism (1907-2007). The Cerisy Conference. Basel-Boston-Berlin: Birkhäuser, pp. 131-145.

Friedman, Michael [2000]: A Parting of the Ways. Carnap, Cassirer, and Heidegger. London: Open Court.

Gödel, Kurt [1990, original 1964]: "What is Cantor's Continuum Problem?", in Feferman, Solomon, et al. (eds.), Kurt Gödel Collected Works, Vol. II: Publications 1938-1974. New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 254-270.

Gödel, Kurt [1990, original 1958]: "Über eine bisher noch nicht benützte Erweiterung des finiten Standpunktes" ("On a hitherto unutilized extension of the finitary standpoint"), in Feferman, Solomon, et al. (eds.), Kurt Gödel Collected Works, Vol. II: Publications 1938-1974. New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 240-251.

Kaufmann, Felix [1978, original 1930] (Brian McGuinness, ed.): The Infinite in Mathematics. Logico-Mathematical Writings. New York: Springer. (Vienna Circle Collection vol. 9).

Tieszen, Richard [2005]: Phenomenology, Logic, and the Philosophy of Mathematics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Tragesser, Robert S. [1984]: Husserl and Realism in Logic and Mathematics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

van Atten, Mark [1999]: Phenomenology of choice sequences. Utrecht: Zeno Institute of Philosophy.