Essays on Hegel's Philosophy of Subjective Spirit

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David S. Stern (ed.), Essays on Hegel's Philosophy of Subjective Spirit, SUNY Press, 2013, 254pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438444451.

Reviewed by Jocelyn Hoy, University of California, Santa Cruz


What are Hegel's views on madness, paranormal activities, and habits? Does he have a theory of emotions or a theory of language? How do his accounts of these topics affect our understanding of his famous discussions of self-consciousness and freedom? These questions and others are addressed in this first English-language anthology on Hegel's relatively little known Philosophy of Subjective Spirit. Prompted perhaps by Robert Williams's 2007 translation of Hegel's 1827-28 Lectures on the Philosophy of Spirit as well as by earlier translations of previously unknown supplementary materials to Hegel's Philosophy of Subjective Spirit, this renewed scholarly interest in Hegel's "philosophy of mind" will also shed light on Hegel's more well-known texts.

Essays in this volume that I find of particular value discuss Hegel's emphasis on the importance of spirit's embodiment, his appreciation of the roles of habits and emotions in the formation of the embodied self, and his continued insistence on intersubjectivity for self-actualization and freedom. Some of the essays trace Hegel's debt to his contemporaries in religion, psychology or parapsychology, not just to prominent philosophers such as Aristotle and Kant, others instructively compare and contrast Hegel's views with 20th century thinkers such as Michel Foucault, Pierre Bourdieu, Thomas Nagel, Colin McGinn, John Searle, Galen Strawson. This excellent anthology not only challenges any understanding of Hegel as an "Idealist," but also questions other labels and dichotomies prominent in our anglophone philosophical tradition. I will highlight salient points from each of the thirteen essays, comparing and contrasting where appropriate, and conclude with a few critical remarks.

David S. Stern provides a brief but informative introduction on the historical context of the publication of Philosophy of Subjective Spirit. This is followed by Angelica Nuzzo's "Anthropolgy, Geist, and the Soul-Body Relation: The Systematic Beginning of Hegel's Philosophy of Spirit." Nuzzo argues that Hegel's concept of Geist, while "defined as the 'truth' of nature and thereby set unquestionably much 'higher' than nature . . . does not cease to be determined throughout its development in relation to nature" (p. 1). She examines different versions of the Anthropology -- the first main subsection of subjective spirit -- and claims that for Hegel the "relation to corporeality remains the basis of spirit's development" (p. 7), thus rejecting any simple, metaphysical notion of idealism which denies the reality of matter or body.

Italo Testa ("Hegel's Naturalism or Soul and Body in the Encyclopedia") agrees with Nuzzo's interpretation. For Testa, the "local" question of the relation of soul and body must be seen in terms of its place within Hegel's systematic philosophy of spirit, and thus has a "global" meaning that redefines the very terms "idealism" and "materialism." Opposing ontological dualism, Hegel's view can be considered a "naturalism," provided that Nature is conceived in very broad, non-reductionist terms. As Testa puts it, "Spirit . . . is for Hegel nothing other than a determinate constellation of relations of Nature itself as the one single reality. This thesis could be called Hegel's Naturalism" (p. 23). Testa sees Hegel's philosophy of subjective spirit as the "naturalistic epistemological strategy, aimed at refuting the premises that generate the dualistic opposition between knowledge as the exercise of capacities proper to our natural being and knowledge as the exercise of rational activities" (p. 27). He highlights the importance of Hegel's discussion of "habits" that form a "second nature," shaping the body through practices into an "expressive sign" (p. 28). Habits situate our finite selves within social practices and institutions, such that Hegel's naturalism is best characterized as "Social Naturalism": "the institutions of social life are extensions and objectifications of human nature and of individual mind. This, at bottom, is the combined meaning of the Hegelian thesis that soul is the substance of Spirit and habit its universal form" (p. 33).

Simon Lumsden expands on Testa's viewpoint in "Between Nature and Spirit: Hegel's Account of Habit". According to Lumsden, "habit is more than just a transition point dissolving itself and nature with it in the move from nature to spirit. The way Hegel conceives habit, particularly his characterization of it as second nature, challenges the dualism of spirit and nature" (p. 121). Engaging John McDowell's attempt to "draw on Hegel, particularly his notion of second nature," to reveal the "unboundedness of the conceptual," Lumsden argues that Hegel's account of habit and second nature also challenges the current distinction between the "space of reasons" and the "space of causes." For Lumsden, Hegel importantly recognizes habit as "a domain of lived experience that is between discursivity and receptivity that we do not transcend" (p. 122). In opposition to such thinkers as Korsgaard, Habermas and Brandom, Lumsden points out that habits cannot be understood as "self-consciously authorized (or owned) or natural and yet [they] are part of human identity" (p. 123). He offers a detailed account of Hegel's notion of habit to illustrate exactly how habit is neither purely reflective nor purely natural. Lumsden nicely compares Hegel's account with Bourdieu's notion of habitus that shows "how social and practical norms are embodied in habits that are at the heart of our relation to the world and ourselves" (129). On this view, trying to change one's habits is not only difficult to accomplish but is indeed challenging, even threatening to one's very sense of identity.

Jeffrey Reid ("How the Dreaming Soul Became the Feeling Soul, between the 1827 and 1830 Editions of Hegel's Philosophy of Subjective Spirit") traces the historical context of Hegel's discussion of "the feeling soul" back to an earlier 1794 manuscript and to various psychological and religious influences on Hegel's views. A main point to be gleaned from Reid's careful historical analysis is that Hegel's insistence on the "naturalness" of the feeling soul -- its rootedness in organic particularities -- allows Hegel to attack his rival Schleiermacher's "religion of feeling" as an expression of a cultural malaise rooted in pathological conditions of the "delusional feeling soul" (p. 46).

In "The Dark Side of Subjective Spirit: Hegel on Mesmerism, Madness, and Ganglia," Glenn Alexander Magee presents a fascinating exposition of Hegel's surprisingly extensive discussions of magic, animal magnetism, and other paranormal behavior in his philosophy of subjective spirit. According to Hegel, these conditions are genuine phenomena that occur when the "'feeling' part of the soul temporarily usurps the higher-level, 'mental' functions" (p. 60). For Hegel, understanding these sorts of phenomena is valuable for medical practice. Furthermore, Hegel believes his speculative philosophy can account for such behavior, whereas science and philosophy "stuck" at the level of the analytic Understanding cannot. "Hegel consequently regards his ability to explain these dark matters as yet another verification of the power of speculative philosophy" (p. 66).

Nicholas Mowad's essay, provocatively entitled "Awakening to Madness and Habituation to Death in Hegel's 'Anthropology,'" situates the Anthropology within the Logic, and Philosophies of Nature and Spirit, as well as offering a comprehensive summary of the Anthropology itself couched in Hegelian terminology. Madness belongs to the stage of "self-feeling," and occurs when one particular feeling forces out all other feelings, "usurping the soul's entire life" (p. 96).

Mario Wenning continues the discussion of madness in "Awakening from Madness: the Relationship between Spirit and Nature in Light of Hegel's Account of Madness." Like most authors in this volume, Wenning insists that for Hegel the natural dimension "remains a constitutive background of our mental lives" (p. 107). For Hegel madness is not simply the loss of rationality but, rather, "perhaps the only access to the archaic natural past that a rational subject bears inside itself" (p. 111). Without romanticizing madness as a form of genius, Hegel -- in contrast to Michel Foucault -- sees madness as a pathology, both spiritual and physical (p. 117). Concluding his enlightening discussion of Hegel on madness, Wenning notes that Hegel is able to account "for the rational mind's vulnerability, a vulnerability which shows that it retains its natural conditionedness as an essential feature" (p. 117).

Jason J. Howard ("Hegel on the Emotions: Coordinating Form and Content") credits Hegel with a complex, sophisticated theory of emotions that shows how emotions "function in the transformation of the natural soul to the thinking (reflexive) will" (p. 80). Nevertheless, Howard locates an important flaw in Hegel's account. Surprisingly, Hegel overlooks the socio-cultural influences on the formation and experience of emotions. Instead, he insists on a unique physiological basis for each type of emotion -- a view now refuted by scientific studies. This means that emotions themselves need to be "filled" by cognitive states separable from the emotion. Thus, according to Howard, Hegel unfortunately "ends up portraying emotion as little more than an enabling condition of rationality" (p. 83).

Jere O'Neill Surber reviews "Hegel's Linguistic Thought in the Philosophy of Subjective Spirit," a topic not explicitly considered elsewhere in Hegel's corpus. Surber shows that Hegel recognized the need for addressing the role of language in philosophy because the "Metacritics" -- notably, Herder and Hamann -- had attacked any sort of Kantian project that attempts to offer a "transcendental" or universalist approach to philosophical issues. According to the metacritics, such an attempt must be couched in a natural language, susceptible to its own historical and cultural contexts, thus infecting the supposed universalist philosophical language with the same historical contingency (p. 183). While Surber appreciates Hegel's attempt to deal with this issue in the "Representation" section of Subjective Spirit, Surber thinks this discussion "remains somewhat sketchy and overly schematic in its details and, at certain points, may well create more problems for other areas of Hegel's thought than it resolved" (p. 196). Surber wishes that Hegel had worked out a more extensive "philosophy of language" alongside his philosophies of art, religion, history and politics (p. 196).

Some prominent German philosophers and Hegel scholars, such as Jürgen Habermas and Axel Honneth, argue that Hegel's important accounts of intersubjectivity in his earlier Jena philosophy, notably the 1807 Phenomenology, become repressed or eliminated in his late systematic philosophy of the Absolute, whose Idea is unfolded in the Logic. Countering this interpretation are the essays by Marina F. Bykova on "The 'Struggle for Recognition' and the Thematization of Intersubjectivity" and by Robert R. Williams on "Freedom as Correlation: Recognition and Self-Actualization in Hegel's Philosophy of Spirit." Bykova and Williams provide excellent textual support from both the "Phenomenology" section of Subjective Spirit as well as the 1820s Lectures on the Philosophy of Spirit to argue that "intersubjective interaction is not an arbitrary act . . . but is necessitated by the very concept of self-consciousness" (Bykova, p. 148). Furthermore, as Williams puts it, "recognition of our mutual interdependence . . . is normative for manifesting our individual free agency" (p. 150). Both these essays argue for the continuity of Hegel's later discussions with the earlier formulations, and emphasize his essential claim even in the later works that genuine freedom and self-actualization require intersubjective recognition and communal mediation. Bykova and Williams provide excellent, detailed textual support for their positions.

In "The Psychology of Will and the Deduction of Right: Rethinking Hegel's Theory of Practical Intelligence," Richard Dien Winfield offers a precise, detailed account of the developmental stages of the will in "practical intelligence" through practical feeling, impulse and choice, and the pursuit of happiness prior to the full-blown sense of freedom within Objective Spirit in The Philosophy of Right. Those interested in understanding the varied nuances of "willing" will find this scholarly expository essay especially instructive.

Philip T. Grier's discussion of "The Relation of Mind to Nature: Two Paradigms" concludes this anthology. Rather than presenting a detailed exposition of any specific portion of Hegel's Subjective Spirit, Grier opposes two conceptions of the relation of mind and nature he dubs "Comprehensive" and "Narrow." The Comprehensive paradigm is "loosely Hegelian" in attempting to explain how mind can be understood to have arisen from nature, and how nature can be comprehended by mind (p.224). Hegel claims that "nature and mind are two significantly overlapping phases of a single continuous self-developing process" (p. 227), and thus, for Grier, his account can be considered a "thorough-going naturalism, albeit of a distinct type" (p. 228). The Narrow paradigm, on Grier's reading, sees the relation of mind and nature "as simply the question of how a mental event can be related to a brain event, where the latter is construed as physical" (p. 224). For Grier, the basis of the Hegelian Comprehensive paradigm is a system of "internal relations in the form of the dialectically self-developing Concept" (p. 229). While Moore and Russell banned internal relations from a world constituted by externally related atomic propositions, the writings of Wilfrid Sellars, followed by John McDowell and Robert Brandom, lend credence again to the idea that both mind and world are conceptually structured and hence that relations are inevitably both internal and external (p. 231). Grier then offers a clear, succinct and intriguing story of the presuppositions, features, advocates and puzzles of the Narrow conception.

Grier concludes by claiming that the Comprehensive and Narrow paradigms are fundamentally incommensurable in several crucial respects. While readers may find this conclusion either unsurprising or depressing, he nicely points out important presuppositions of the Comprehensive paradigm -- for example, an Aristotelian-Hegelian "neo-vitalism" -- that some proponents of the Narrow conception may find tempting and interesting. In any case, Grier provides those coming from outside a Hegelian tradition a clear and coherent account of what that tradition can offer to contemporary discussions in philosophy of mind, social philosophy and ethics.

Obviously my cursory remarks cannot do justice to the high level of scholarship and intellectual intricacy in these essays. This anthology shows how Hegel's neglected philosophy of subjective spirit is extremely important not only for Hegel scholars but also to philosophers interested in exploring different philosophical approaches to what have come to be regarded as the standard philosophical problems. One of the recurrent themes I find is the claim that Hegel may be considered a naturalist as opposed to an idealist traditionally conceived. Studying Hegel's philosophy of subjective spirit, then, implicitly calls for a fresh, more comprehensive understanding of naturalism itself.