Essays on Kant

Placeholder book cover

Henry E. Allison, Essays on Kant, Oxford University Press, 2012, 289pp, $35.00 (pbk.), ISBN 9780199647026.

Reviewed by Nicholas Stang, University of Miami


Few people have had more impact on how Anglo-American philosophers read Kant than Henry Allison. Starting with a series of articles in the 1970s and 80s on transcendental idealism, followed by his massively influential Kant's Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense (1983), Allison has revolutionized how many philosophers understand Kant's distinction between appearances and the 'thing in itself.' Since then he has extended this innovative interpretation of Kant's idealism to his practical philosophy and his theory of freedom (Kant's Theory of Freedom, 1990) and written three major commentaries: on the 'Critique of aesthetic judgment,' the first half of the third critique (Kant's Theory of Taste, 2001); on Hume's Treatise (Custom and Reason in Hume: A Kantian Reading of the First Book of Hume's Treatise, 2008); and on the Groundwork (Kant's Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, 2011). In 2004 Allison published a significantly revised second edition of Kant's Transcendental Idealism, deepening and modifying his original interpretation and replying to his various critics. In addition to the books there has been a steady stream of papers in journals and edited volumes on all aspects of Kant's philosophy; it is difficult to think of a significant issue in Kant's philosophy that Allison has not written about.

The present volume, containing seventeen previously published essays, is divided into four parts. The essays of the first part concerns Allison's interpretation of transcendental idealism, in particular, the innovations in his interpretation that appear in the 2004 edition of Kant's Transcendental Idealism. The second part contains essays on Kant's moral philosophy: three essays on freedom, and two on questions that arise in particular Kantian works and their consequences for larger interpretative issues (Kant's claim in the Religion that we have a propensity to evil, the claim in the Groundwork that all of the different formulations of the categorical imperative are equivalent). The essays in the third part cover issues in the third Critique not dealt with in Kant's Theory of Taste: in particular, Kant's argument in the two Introductions to that work for the principle of the 'formal purposiveness' of nature and, more generally, the theory of teleology in the second half of the work, the 'Critique of teleological judgment.' The fourth section contains four essays on Kant's theory of history. The essays in each section are tightly connected: they show Allison circling around a single problem posed by Kant's texts, either philosophical or interpretive and usually both, approaching it from different perspectives. The different parts are also linked: the reflections on Kant's distinction between 'transcendental idealism' and 'transcendental realism' in part one lead naturally to the discussion of Kant's resolution of the compatibility of necessity and freedom in part two; particularly impressive is the way that the essays in part three, on Kant's theory of teleology in the Critique of Judgment, support and enrich Allison's' reading of Kant's theory of history in part four. Throughout the diversity of this material, Allison sustains his characteristic clarity, seemingly encyclopedic knowledge of Kant's texts, and unified vision of Kant's Critical philosophy. Since I cannot discuss all of these essays or the many issues they raise in a single review, I will instead focus on the essays in the first two parts and the over-arching theme that links them: Allison's interpretation of transcendental idealism.

1. Transcendental Idealism

The first essay, "Commentary on Section Nine of the Antimony of Pure Reason" was originally written for a collaborative commentary on the Critique of Pure Reason.[1] The second essay contains a contribution to an 'author-meets-critics' style symposium on Longuenesse (1998) and Allison's response to Béatrice Longuenesse's response to his critique. The two essays I want to focus on here are three and four.

Essay three, "Kant and the Two Dogmas of Rationalism," contains a very concise and helpful discussion of the relation of Kant to the rationalist tradition, in particular, to two rationalist doctrines: that in every true judgment the predicate is 'contained' in the subject, and that the content of sensible representation is reducible to the content of conceptual representation. Readers will quickly note the Leibnizian provenance of these doctrines, and Allison does not always make it as clear as he could that by "dogmas of rationalism" he means dogmas of Leibniz's rationalism in particular. Allison also exaggerates the extent of the connection between these Leibnizian 'dogmas,' even going so far as to assert at one point that they mutually entail one another (p. 50). But while they may mutually support one another, the claim of entailment is surely incorrect. One can hold (what Kant would express by saying) that all true judgments are analytic, while nonetheless maintaining that the contents of sense perception are irreducible to conceptual contents. For instance, one can hold a direct realist theory of perception on which its contents are simply the objects themselves. True judgments are made about an object by subsuming it under a concept and then unpacking that concept (so all true judgments are analytic). In the other direction, that the contents of sense perception are conceptual contents does not entail that all judgments are analytic; if it does, someone should alert John McDowell.

For our purposes the most interesting aspect of essay three is the final section in which Allison introduces one of the main themes of essay four: that transcendental realism and transcendental idealism are not specific ontological theses about space, time, and appearances, but very broad methodological or 'meta-philosophical' views about the nature of human cognition and the project of epistemology. Allison's key argument here, as in essay four, "Transcendental Realism, Empirical Realism, and Transcendental Idealism," is that Kant treats transcendental idealism and transcendental realism as mutually exclusive and exhaustive philosophical options. Consequently, Allison argues, transcendental realism must be understood, not as some specific ontological thesis about the nature of space, time, or appearances (e.g., that these items exist independently of any finite mind), but as a "kind of meta-philosophical stance from which the problem of human knowledge is considered" (p. 64). By parity of reasoning, transcendental idealism is not a specific ontological thesis (e.g., that space, time, and appearances exist at least partly in virtue of finite cognitive subjects), but as a similarly broad 'meta-philosophical' stance.

A plausible case can be made that Kant uses the terms 'transcendental realism' and 'transcendental idealism' in such a way that they (are intended to) exhaust logical space, but I think Allison is wrong in his characterization of them as 'meta-philosophical' stances, and in his identification of their specific content. Let us start with the point on which he is on the most solid ground: the alleged exhaustiveness of 'transcendental realism' and 'transcendental idealism,' as Kant uses these terms. Perhaps the strongest case for the Exhaustiveness Thesis is Kant's definitions of these terms at A490-1/B518-9, which Allison discusses[2]:

We have sufficiently proved in the Transcendental Aesthetic that everything intuited in space or in time, hence all objects of an experience possible for us, are nothing but appearances, i.e., mere representations, which, as they are represented, as extended beings or series of alterations, have outside our thoughts no existence grounded in itself. This doctrine I call transcendental idealism. The realist, in the transcendental signification, makes these modifications of our sensibility into things subsisting in themselves, and hence makes mere representations into things in themselves. (A490-1/B518-9[3])

Allison writes, "As Kant here describes these two forms of transcendentalism, they appear to encompass the entire philosophical landscape" (p. 63). But that is precisely not how things appear in this passage. Transcendental realism asserts, and transcendental idealism denies, that objects in space (henceforth, 'objects') have "outside our thoughts [Gedanken] an existence grounded in itself." So one would think that an idealist who denies that objects exist at all would count neither as a transcendental realist nor as a transcendental idealist. The case for Allison's Exhaustiveness Thesis is improved somewhat when we look at the next paragraph:

One would do us an injustice if one tried to ascribe to us that long-decried empirical idealism that, while assuming the proper reality of space, denies the existence of extended beings in it, or at least finds this existence doubtful, and so in this respect admits no satisfactorily provable distinction between dream and truth. (A491/B519)

If the Exhaustiveness Thesis is true, then empirical idealism must be a kind of transcendental realism (since Kant has just told us that it is not a kind of transcendental idealism). Now, while it might initially seem counter-intuitive that "denying or finding doubtful" the existence of objects (empirical idealism) is compatible with claiming that they have an existence "grounded in themselves" (transcendental realism), there is something on which both positions agree: what it would be for objects to exist, whether or not they do exist. The transcendental realist and the empirical idealist, on this reading, agree on what it takes for objects to exist: they must exist 'in themselves' where this means their existence is not grounded in facts about our experience or sensibility. This picture of their relation is suggested by Kant's remarks elsewhere that "it is really this transcendental realist who afterwards plays the empirical idealist" (A369) and "as far as I know all those psychologists who cling to empirical idealism are transcendental realists" (A372).[4] Henceforth, 'transcendental realism' will refer to the view, shared, with the empirical idealist, about what it would be for objects in space to exist.

The more important question, though, is whether the Exhaustiveness Thesis (that transcendental realism, so understood, and transcendental idealism exhaust logical space) plays any significant role in any Kantian argument, to which I think the answer is 'no.' One of the well-known interpretive puzzles about the Antinomial Conflicts of Pure Reason is that Kant takes them to show that transcendental realism entails both the Thesis and the Antithesis in each Antinomy, which are contraries (they cannot be both true), and that this constitutes an indirect proof of transcendental idealism. This raises two puzzles: (i) why is transcendental realism committed to the Thesis and the Antithesis of each Antinomy?, and (ii) even if this is so, how can Kant conclude that transcendental idealism is true? First, I just want to point out that if 'transcendental realism' means what Allison thinks it does, then (i) is clearly false. A thoroughgoing empirical idealist (who is a transcendental realist, on Allison's understanding) who denies that there is space or time or objects in space (they are all illusions) is committed neither to the Thesis (space and time are bounded) nor the Antithesis (space and time are unbounded) of the first Antinomy. But if this is correct, then 'transcendental realism' in the Antinomies means something more specific than what Allison means by that term, which means that the Exhaustiveness Thesis, as formulated by Allison, does not play a role in Kant's "indirect" proof of transcendental idealism. This removes a key piece of support for Allison's claim that 'transcendental realism' and 'transcendental idealism' are understood so broadly by Kant that they exhaust logical space.

In the remainder of this section I will object to his identification of what these philosophical views in fact are. In essay four, Allison claims that transcendental realism is the thesis that "spatiotemporal predicates are applicable to things in general" (pp. 67-68). This, however, has some problematic consequences. It entail that, for instance, Platonism is not a form of transcendental realism, which, together with Allison's Exclusivity Thesis, would entail that Platonism is a form of transcendental idealism.

In "Transcendental Realism, Empirical Realism, and Transcendental Idealism" Allison begins by characterizing transcendental idealism as the negation of transcendental realism (since he is assuming the Exhaustiveness Thesis), so its content is: spatiotemporal predicates do not apply to all things in general. Allison tries to connect this with more traditional ways of characterizing the transcendental realism/idealism distinction by noting that if spatiotemporal predicates apply to all things in general then, assuming that the concept of 'things in themselves' is a concept of things in general, it follows that the transcendental realist holds that things in themselves are spatiotemporal. However, it does not follow that the transcendental idealist denies that things in themselves are spatiotemporal. By denying that spatiotemporal predicates apply to all things in general, the transcendental idealist is not committed to denying that they apply to one species of (or way of conceptualizing) things: things in themselves. So Allison's own characterization of transcendental idealism in this essay fails to explain why it entails non-spatiotemporality of things in themselves, despite Kant's characterization of it in precisely those terms at A369.

Allison tries to remedy this gap in his argument by giving an independent argument that things in themselves are not spatiotemporal: "inasmuch as the concept of a thing in itself contains the thought of something as it is in itself, independently of any sensible intuition, it requires an active factoring out or exclusion of any contribution of sensibility rather than merely a refusal or failure to factor it in" (p. 74, my emphasis). This interpretation, developed more fully in Allison (2004), repudiates an alternative model that some have attributed to him (e.g., Van Cleve 1998). On the alternative model, talk of things in themselves is merely a way of talking about objects of a discursive intellect in general, whether or not they are given in spatiotemporal intuition:

(i)             Things in themselves are F ↔ representing the object of a discursive intellect in general involves representing it as F.

James Van Cleve and others objected to this model (which they took to be Allison's) that it licenses only the conclusion that it is not the case that things in themselves are determinately spatiotemporal, not Kant's own conclusions: things in themselves are determinately not spatiotemporal. The quoted passage contains Allison's response to this objections; he rejects (i) in favor of:

(ii)           Things in themselves are ~F ↔ the representation of objects as F is a sensible condition on our cognition (and thus does not apply to the object of a discursive cognition in general).[5]

This entails that 'things in themselves are not in space and time' is a direct consequence of the definition of 'things in themselves' talk; a foundational claim of Kant's epistemology is rendered analytic. Allison's response is that the substantive synthetic a priori claim is that there are sensible conditions on our cognition, and they are space and time. So while the judgment 'things in themselves are not in space and time' may be a direct consequence of (ii), (ii) would be false unless there were sensible conditions on cognition. We cannot know that things in themselves are non-spatiotemporal without knowing a synthetic a priori judgment (that space and time are sensible conditions on our cognition), so this claim is saved from being analytic.

Finally, Allison offers a third, distinct characterization of transcendental idealism, one that plays an important role in his account of the resolution of the Third Antinomy and is prominently featured in Allison (2004). On this reading, transcendental idealism is the meta-philosophical or meta-cognitive thesis that there is no 'way the world is' independently of a perspective or standpoint on it. Consequently, the theoretical standpoint (in which we represent objects using space and time and categories) and the practical standpoint (in which we represent ourselves as freely acting rational agents) are not 'in competition.' Neither of them correctly describes how things 'really are' because the question of 'how things really are' independent of such a standpoint is precisely the assumption of transcendental realism that Kant wants us to abandon. The problem with this 'internal realist' reading of transcendental idealism[6] is that it offers no room for one of Kant's most characteristic claims about the relation between the empirical world (the world as revealed from the theoretical standpoint) and the 'intelligible' world (the world as revealed from the practical standpoint): that the intelligible world is the ground of the empirical world.[7] Allison repeatedly objects to more traditional, metaphysical readings of transcendental idealism by claiming that Kant does not mean to claim that appearances (the denizens of the empirical world) are less 'real' than noumena or things in themselves (the denizens of the intelligible world). But, as metaphysical interpreters of transcendental idealism have long pointed out, there are at least two notions of reality at play here and two ways in which noumena might be said to be more real than phenomena:

(i)             Are appearances/phenomena illusory (unreal)?

(ii)           Are appearances/phenomena less fundamental ontologically than things in themselves/noumena?


From Erich Adickes to Karl Ameriks to Richard Aquila, metaphysical interpreters have pointed out that the answer to the first question is 'no' while the answer to the second question is 'yes.' It is a significant weakness of Allison's reading of transcendental idealism in these essays that he never addresses this distinction, and never tries to accommodate within his interpretation Kant's repeated claims that noumena are the ground of phenomena.[8] After all, on Allison's view it appears that the opposite is true: if the concept of things in themselves is the concept of things not having the spatiotemporal properties they must have if we are to experience them, then it seems that the concept of things in themselves is dependent upon the concept of full-fledged objects of experience and their sensible conditions. Allison owes us an explanation of why, on his reading, appearances are not the grounds of things in themselves.

2. Freedom of the Will

The second group of essays concern Kant's moral philosophy and, with the exception of essays six and eight, specifically, Kant's theory of freedom. Essay six, "On the Very Idea of a Propensity to Evil," treats an especially difficult interpretive puzzle in Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone: what does Kant mean by attributing to human beings an 'innate propensity to evil' and what grounds does he have for doing so? Essay eight is about Kant's claim in the Groundwork that the various formulations of the categorical imperative (e.g., the formula of humanity, the formula of universal law) are "at bottom only so many formulae of the very same law, and any one of them of itself unites the other two in it" (4: 436).

The other essays in this section deal with a connected set of issues in, roughly, Groundwork III, the Critique of Practical Reason, and the resolution of the third Antinomy in the Critique of Pure Reason. The jumping-off point in several essays is Kant's claim in Groundwork III that: "to every rational being having a will we must necessarily lend the idea of freedom also, under which he acts" (4:448). Kant states the point in the third-person, but it is perhaps easiest to appreciate in the first-person case: when I act I presuppose that I am free from determination by my sensible desires, inclinations, etc., that I am free to act on these inclinations or not act on them. If we extend this point to other rational agents we get: the idea of another person as a practically rational agent involves representing her as free from determination by desires, inclinations, previous intentions, etc. We (and she herself!) must represent her as able to act for reasons because she has endorsed those reasons (incorporated them into her maxim), not because they causally determine her to act. One might wonder what exactly 'freedom' means here, and I take it that, on Allison's interpretation, it requires at least: the capacity to (i) act for reasons, (ii) because one has endorsed those reasons (incorporated them into the maxim of one's action), where the activation of this capacity is (iii) contra-causal (one's actions are not causally determined by the past, given the laws of nature). The interpretive difficulty is understanding what part this presupposition of freedom plays in Kant's argument that we in fact possess this kind of freedom. After all, even a hard determinist might admit that practical reasoning constitutively involves the illusion of contra-causal freedom.[9]

This problem becomes especially acute when we recall that Kant has already argued in the Second Analogy of the Critique of Pure Reason that every alteration in the empirical world has a sufficient and determining cause. As Allison reads Groundwork III, Kant's resolution of this problem consists in distinguishing two 'standpoints' from which we can view our actions: we can view them from the 'theoretical' standpoint as events like any others in the empirical world, or we can view them from the 'practical standpoint' in which we think of them as moves in a 'space of reasons' that are normatively evaluable and therefore (contra-causally) free.[10] Clearly, how we understand this resolution will depend crucially upon how we understand transcendental idealism and the distinction between the two standpoints.

This transforms the conflict of the presupposition of freedom with the fact of casual determination into a question about the potential conflict between the 'practical standpoint' and the 'theoretical standpoint': which (if either) accurately represents the way things are? Am I in fact free from causal determination when I act? Or are all of my actions in fact part of a deterministic causal nexus, while I am subject to the persistent illusion that I am free? This is where Allison's interpretation of transcendental idealism as a 'meta-philosophical' doctrine becomes relevant (see previous section). While, in the first set of essays, Allison characterized transcendental idealism in several distinct ways, in the context of the freedom-determination problem his main characterization is the 'meta-philosophical' or 'internal realist' one: there is no 'way things are' independent of a standpoint (a structured set of norms for making claims about things), so the question of which standpoint (theoretical or practical) is 'right' is incoherent. The apparent conflict between freedom and determination is revealed to rest on the mistaken assumption that I must be either free or determined period, while in fact I can correctly be judged to be free and undetermined from one perspective (the practical) and can correctly be judged to be determined and unfree from another (the theoretical). This, in essence, is Allison's reconstruction of Kant's resolution to the Third Antinomy, discussed in the first essay of the collection, tying together the themes of the first half of the book: transcendental idealism and freedom.

Lest this seem like warmed-over relativism, Allison argues that these standpoints each have a privileged status: one of them is constitutive (for beings with our kinds of intellect) of reasoning about given objects, while the other is constitutive of reasoning about how to act. So the practical standpoint is not some arbitrarily invented way of representing myself, cooked-up solely for the sake of vindicating my freedom. Taking the practical standpoint on oneself is constitutive of being a practically rational agent. Consequently, the presupposition of my freedom is warranted (within the practical standpoint) in virtue of being a central component of my representation of myself as a practically rational agent. Assuming that the practical standpoint is itself internally coherent (in Kantian terms, that practical reason is consistent with itself), the only challenge to claims warranted within the practical standpoint is the putative contradiction between that standpoint and the theoretical standpoint. If Kant can show that this putative conflict is based on a fallacy (that there is no truth independent of standpoints) then he will have gone a long way to showing that freedom and necessity are compatible.

I think this view has a lot going for it. In particular, I find it more plausible than some other contemporary forms of compatibilism. Essay five, "We Can Act Only Under the Idea of Freedom," contains a helpful comparison of Kant's theory of freedom (as interpreted by Allison) to Daniel Dennett's work on free will and more contemporary forms of naturalism.

However, as an interpretation of Kant's theory of free will (and the resolution of the freedom-determinism problem) I think it is seriously lacking. For one, it depends upon the interpretation of transcendental idealism as the thesis that there is no 'way things are' independent of a standpoint, and thus inherits all of the problems of that interpretation (see above). I will outline what I take to be the two most pressing such problems.

First, there is always a worry that a given standpoint might be arbitrary or created ad hoc. I do not think this worry arises for the practical standpoint as Allison characterizes it until we realize that, according to Kant (in Groundwork III and elsewhere), the perspective that allows me to represent myself as free is a perspective in which I represent myself as non-spatiotemporal. Following Allison's interpretation of the non-spatiotemporality of things in themselves (see previous section), this does not mean merely that I abstract away or ignore my spatiotemporal properties, but that I deny that I possess them (at least from this standpoint). Recall how Allison interprets claims about things in themselves:

Things in themselves are ~F  the representation of objects as F is a sensible condition on our cognition (and thus does not apply to the object of a discursive cognition in general).

Allison owes us an explanation of why representing myself from the practical standpoint involves representing myself as a thing in itself in this sense. It may involve merely 'abstracting away' from my spatiotemporal predicates (as Van Cleve reads earlier presentations of the view), but Allison rejects that way of understanding talk about things in themselves; why does it involve negating them? Perhaps, when I take the practical standpoint on myself I regard my actions as normatively evaluable within a space of reasons, and perhaps the idea of a 'space' of reasons is not the idea of a spatiotemporal order (not a 'space' in Kant's sense), so in so representing my actions I am not representing them as spatiotemporal; but why does it involve representing them as non-spatiotemporal?

Furthermore, Allison's interpretation inherits the problem I noted earlier: it is not clear that he can make room for Kant's claim that the practical standpoint is more fundamental than the theoretical standpoint. This is particularly pressing in the case of Kant' theory of free will, for Kant's deduction of the categorical imperative in Groundwork III crucially relies on the claim that the intelligible world (the world as revealed in the practical standpoint) is the ground of the sensible world (the world as revealed in the empirical standpoint).[11] And this is not the only place where Kant's theory of freedom appears to rely essentially on a claim about the ontological dependence of the phenomenal upon the intelligible. In the resolution of the third Antinomy, Kant repeatedly asserts that one's intelligible character is the cause of one's empirical character.[12] Allison's reading of this (essay one, p. 26) is that one has one's empirical character (dispositions to act in certain ways) because of the rational norms one has freely chosen to endorse. But the question then is: from what standpoint is that explanatory claim being made (since there is no truth independent of a standpoint)? Surely not from the theoretical standpoint: the character of acts as being moved in a 'space of reasons' is not available to theoretical reason. So it must be made from the practical standpoint. So Allison must say that, from the practical point of view, I regard my general disposition to act in certain ways (my empirical character) as the result of my own free choice to live by certain rational norms and values. It is hard to know, without hearing more about how my empirical character "results" from my free choices, whether this is compatible with Kant's claim that the latter is the ground of the former.

However, these are issues about which Allison has written extensively elsewhere. Allison's interpretations of Kant in these essays are, as always, something about which Kant scholars will have to think, and argue, for years to come.


Allison, H. 2004. Kant's Transcendental Idealism: An Interpretation and Defense. Revised Second Edition. New Haven: Yale University Press.

Kant, I. 1998. Critique of Pure Reason. Trans. and Ed. P. Guyer, A. Wood. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Longuenesse, B. 1998. Kant and the Capacity to Judge. Princeton: Princeton University Press.

Van Cleve, J. 1999. Problems from Kant. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Willascheck, M and Mohr., G. (Eds). Immanuel Kant: Kritik der reinen Vernunft. 1998. Berlin: Akademie Verlag.

[1] Willascheck and Mohr (1998).

[2] He also discusses A369, but parallel issues arise for that passage.

[3] The Critique of Pure Reason is cited in the usual fashion: the page in the 1781 edition (A), followed by the page in the 1781 edition (B). Other works of Kant are cited by their volume and page number in the Academy edition, published the Berlin-Brandenburg Academy of Sciences. Translations from the Critique are taken from the Guyer-Wood translation, Kant (1998).

[4] But note that even this passage undermines Allison's reading: if as far as Kant knows all empirical idealists are transcendental realists, then it is not the case that by definitionempirical idealism is a form of transcendental realism (as Allison thinks it is).

[5] Cf. Allison's response to Van Cleve in Allison (2004), 42-45.

[6] Allison notes the similiarity to 1980s Hilary Putnam at p. 68, note 2.

[7] E.g., Groundwork III "the world of understanding contains the ground of the world of sense" (4:453).

[8] He addresses a similar objection by Ameriks in Allison (2004), p. 45.

[9] Allison also addresses one of the oldest chestnuts of Kant scholarship -- whether Kant fundamentally alters his proof of freedom from the Groundwork in the second Critique -- but his view here is somewhat more traditional (he thinks that Kant does reverse himself) and somewhat orthogonal to what I take to be the main interest of these essays (transcendental idealism as the resolution of the conflict between freedom and necessity), so I will not discuss it further here.

[10] Cf. 4:452.

[11] 4:453.

[12] A546/B574, A551/B579, A556/B584, A557/B585.