Essays on Paradoxes

Placeholder book cover

Terence Horgan,  Essays on Paradoxes, Oxford University Press, 2016, 336pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199858422.

Reviewed by Colin R. Caret, Yonsei University


There are many insights to be gleaned from this book, but perhaps the most important is this: what at first seem like solutions to disparate problems may, in fact, turn out to be parts of a bigger picture. This is a heartening thought for any scholars who find their attention drawn to multiple topics at the same time. The essays in this collection present Terence Horgan's considered views on the Newcomb problem, the Monty Hall problem, the Two-Envelope Paradox, the sorites paradox, and the Sleeping Beauty problem. The titular paradoxes, however, largely serve as loci for reflection on practical rationality and epistemic probability. It is an engaging collection full of tantalizing ideas, foremost amongst which is an attack on the broadly Bayesian combination of a subjectivist 'credal' interpretation of probabilities together with the notion that standard conditionalization is 'the only appropriate way to reason dynamically about probabilities' (p.290). There are fourteen chapters but just three previously unpublished essays: one on Newcomb's problem, one on the Sleeping Beauty problem, and a 'big picture' concluding essay on epistemic probability. The final chapter offers the most substantive new contribution, drawing together threads of discussion from several previous chapters to articulate a novel view of the nature and dynamics of probability. Read side by side, these essays also offer a welcome glimpse into one philosopher's process of intellectual development and refinement.

Chapters 1-3 concern the Newcomb problem. With millions of dollars on the line and uncertainty about what the powerful being has predicted, how should you choose? In the first chapter, Horgan argues that a pragmatically appropriate 'back-tracking' reading of counterfactuals supports one-boxing (p.20). The second and third chapters offer a reversal of sorts, as Horgan shows counterfactual analysis to be inessential to reasoning in this situation. In Chapter 3, one of the previously unpublished essays, Horgan proposes that Newcomb's problem is best understood as a deep antinomy of practical reason because it exemplifies a kind of irresoluble clash between constitutive norms of practical rationality (p.57).

Chapter 4 concerns the Monty Hall problem, a surprisingly far-reaching puzzle about a game show. Horgan lucidly explains why it is a mistake to think that there is no reason to switch doors in this type of choice situation. The key is to realize that Monty Hall's revelation of one of the incorrect doors is asymmetrically constrained by the rules of the game. The problem is interesting in its own right and also serves as the central illustration for Horgan's conception of epistemic probability and methods of probabilistic update that he develops in the final chapter.

Chapters 5-6 concern the Two-Envelope Paradox. Having chosen one of the envelopes, possibly the one containing less money, you are given the opportunity to switch to the other envelope. The seemingly paradoxical result is this: despite the lack of any new evidence regarding the contents of the envelopes, the expected utility of switching is 1.25 times that of staying with your original choice. Horgan argues that there is nothing wrong with this calculation (p.89). The flaw behind the paradox lies in the further normative assumption that you ought to switch envelopes based upon this calculation. This turns on the intensionality of epistemic probability contexts which allows us to distinguish between several kinds of expected utility and corresponding principles for maximizing utilities (pp.97-102,114).

Chapters 7-9 concern the sorites paradox and vagueness. Horgan advocates what he calls transvaluationism: the view that vague language is governed by mutually unsatisfiable principles. These principles manifest as norms grounding prohibitions like 'never attribute different statuses to immediate neighbors' of any sorites sequence (p.187). Language can exhibit vagueness precisely because it is a norm-governed practice of this kind, whereas Horgan contends that ontological vagueness is impossible because 'the world itself does not engage in norm-governed practice' (p.190). This view is meant to stand independently of working out the logic of vague discourse.

Chapters 10-13 concern the Sleeping Beauty problem. Horgan holds that when Beauty is awakened, she acquires new information that is pertinent to how she assigns probabilities to the outcome of the coin flip. The result of conditionalizing on this information is the asymmetric 'thirder' probability assignment. A critic, Joel Pust, objects that this requires Beauty to assign a nonzero preliminary probability to the statement 'The coin lands heads and today is Tuesday' which she knows to be impossible as it entails that she is currently asleep and unconscious. In Chapter 12, one of the previously unpublished essays, Horgan appeals to the intensionality of epistemic probability contexts to justify the view that metaphysical impossibilities can, in fact, be epistemic possibilities (pp.242-243).

The final chapter elaborates on Horgan's views about the nature and dynamics of probability. The main points of interest are an evidential interpretation of epistemic probability that is distinct from both subjectivist 'credal' interpretations and 'logical' interpretations; clarification of the notions of preliminary probability and generalized conditionalization; and further reflections on the intensionality of epistemic probability contexts.

As should be clear by now, these essays are densely packed with ideas that will interest anyone working in epistemology, philosophy of language, or logic. I will remark on just a few aspects of the book.

The Frustrations of Transvaluationism

The lack of overall thematic coherence amongst the essays is slightly disappointing. This is felt most acutely with respect to the chapters on the sorites paradox and vagueness. All of the other paradoxes featured in this collection are probabilistic or decision-theoretic in nature, feeding into the final essay. The chapters on the sorites and vagueness, by contrast, only disrupt the coherence and flow of the collection, especially as they were placed smack dab in the middle of the book.

These chapters also have the least to offer. Transvaluationism can be fairly summarized as the view that vagueness does not arise at the level of fundamental ontology, it arises only at the level of 'derivative' ontology and then only because the governing semantic principles of discourse about such properties are incoherent. It is a diagnostic view, akin to inconsistency theories of meaning (see, e.g., Eklund, 2002 and Scharp, 2013). These views aim to explain symptoms of paradoxes like: why do soritical arguments exert cognitive 'pull'? The proposed explanation is that our compulsion to draw such inferences is grounded in semantic competence with the incoherent, vague concepts involved. This view is not without it attractions but it also, notably, does not offer a solution to the paradox.

Horgan suggests, however, that transvaluationism is compatible with several logics that could allow us to regiment vague discourse in order to avoid lapsing into triviality. This is an odd suggestion. Consider the tolerance-like principle ISS: Each item in a sorites sequence has the same status as its immediate neighbors. Horgan claims that all vague concepts induce sorites sequences that conform to this principle (pp.181-182). Now consider a supervaluational treatment of vague discourse according to which, for a given vague predicate B, it is false that if B(n) then B(n+1) for neighboring members of a relevant sorites sequence. If anything, this seems quite incompatible with ISS, yet Horgan says that supervaluational logic is a possible implementation of his view (p.184). It is not clear how this can be right nor how the transvaluationist can rely on such resources to mediate against the paradoxicality of the sorites. The book would probably have been stronger if the chapters on vagueness had been left out entirely.

Beyond Standard Bayesianism

On the other hand, the most rewarding parts of the book are those that closely inform one another, namely, the essays on the two-envelope problem, Sleeping Beauty, and the final 'big picture' essay. A novel account of epistemic probability is developed over the course of these essays. Horgan contends that epistemic probabilities are degrees of evidential support that accrue to propositions under special circumstances. The error behind subjectivist 'credal' interpretations of probability is that they conflate strength of evidence and epistemic confidence. For example, I believe both that Seoul is the capital of South Korea and that King Sejong mandated the institution of the modern Korean alphabet, but I have much firmer evidence for the former proposition than I do for the latter. According to Horgan, I have equal confidence in these propositions insofar as I believe them both, but my belief in one of these propositions is stronger than my belief in the other. By conflating these phenomena, subjective Bayesians come to speak as if belief itself comes in degrees, which it does not (p.283). This is a compelling critique that subjective Bayesians should think about seriously.

According to Horgan, an assignment of epistemic probabilities only arises when an agent knows that a set of propositions 'form a partition of the pertinent space of possibilities and . . . are all equally likely relative to one's available evidence' (p.286). If these divide into subpossibilities, we get a hierarchical probability partition, or HPP, about which we can reason using what Horgan calls 'intuitive' Bayesian updating: removing cells in the HPP eliminated by one's strongest evidence, then reassigning probabilities to the remaining cells in a way that maintains their ratios to one another.

The Monty Hall problem nicely illustrates this process. You know there is a prize behind one of three doors and have equally good evidence for each Pi ('the prize is behind door i'). Suppose you choose door 3 and are then told that Monty will open one of the remaining doors not containing the prize. You have equally good evidence for each (Oi) 'Monty opens door i' but there is an important asymmetry: the only situation in which Monty has any real flexibility about which door to open is if the prize is behind the door you first chose, door 3. We can portray this assignment as HPPA.


P1, 1/3


P2, 1/3


P3, 1/3

            O1, 1/6

            O2, 1/6

Suppose, now, that Monty reveals there is no prize behind door 2. The result of intuitive updating on HPPA is the assignment in HPPB.


P1, 2/3

            O2, 2/3

P3, 1/3

                  O2, 1/3      

To be sure, this shows why one should switch doors in a Monty Hall situation but Horgan also wants to draw a more interesting conclusion. He describes a problem with the same solution reached in a different way:

Consider . . . a version of the Monty Hall Problem in which (i) you choose a door (say, door 3), then (ii) Monty opens a different door (say, door 2), then (iii) Monty informs you that there is a fine prize behind one door and nothing behind the other two doors, and thereafter (iv) Monty informs you about the door-opening policy that he has been following. In this situation you can still reason by . . . using intuitive Bayesian updating to pare down [HPPA] to [HPPB]. But this is not really standard . . .  updating, for two reasons. (p.299)

In this problem, one knows O2 is true even before holding the assignment HPPA, so in this case HPPA is not an assignment of literal prior probabilities and the information driving the update is not new information. This is an example of bracketing a portion of one's evidence to assign what Horgan calls preliminary probabilities, then using a 'generalized' form of updating by bringing pertinent evidence to bear on this assignment.

Horgan sees many lessons here for Bayesians. First, even in the original Monty Hall problem, HPPA was generated ex nihilo from completely new information. Before learning the rules of the game one has no basis to assign probabilities to any of the propositions involved. Contra the usual Bayesian approach, such assignments cannot result from standard conditionalization (pp.295-296). Second, while the results of Horgan's intuitive updating can sometimes be emulated by standard conditionalization, this is not the case for generalized updating on preliminary probabilities. Despite the anti-Bayesian rhetoric, one suspects that some of Horgan's lessons could be accommodated by a more nuanced Bayesian approach.

One reason Horgan wants to make generalized updating palatable is that it plays a central role in his analysis of the Sleeping Beauty problem. Beauty is told on Sunday that she will be put to sleep, awoken on Monday (and later told what day it is), then put back to sleep. A fair coin will then be tossed. If it comes up heads, the experimenters will do nothing. If it comes up tails, her memory of the previous day will be erased and she will then be awoken on Tuesday. Let H be the hypothesis that the coin lands heads and L the hypothesis that it lands tails. Let M be the hypothesis that today is Monday and T the hypothesis that today is Tuesday. Horgan says that when Beauty is awoken, before she knows what day it is, she should assign preliminary probabilities relative to the portion of her evidence that brackets out the fact that she is currently awake, as in HPPC.


H, 1/2
          M, 1/4
          T, 1/4
L, 1/2
          M, 1/4
          T, 1/4

This is something like how a third party would assign probabilities just based on the objective chances. The information that she is now awake, however, eliminates the H+T cell and by generalized updating she arrives at the probability assignment HPPD.


H, 1/3
           M, 1/3
 L, 1/2
           M, 1/3
           T, 1/3

This is Horgan's argument for thirdism and his attempt to clarify precisely why Beauty's being awake is pertinent to how she should assign probabilities to the possible outcomes of the coin toss. Unfortunately, he offers no systematic story about when one should rely on preliminary probabilities or why they ought to be assigned in this way. By contrast, Jenkins (2005) argues that even if Beauty's awakening is pertinent new evidence it should lead her to halfism.

Obviously, I have just scratched the surface of this collection but I hope to have conveyed my appreciation for what it offers. Horgan's work manifests an admirable curiosity and willingness to 'follow his nose' where it leads. Those who are interested in the featured paradoxes or probability more generally will especially benefit from digesting these essays.


Eklund, Matti. 2002. "Inconsistent languages". Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 64:251-275, 2002.

Jenkins, C.S. 2005. "Sleeping beauty: A wake-up call". Philosophia Mathematica, 13:194-201.

Scharp, Kevin. 2013. Replacing Truth. Oxford University Press: Oxford.