Essays on Spinoza's Ethical Theory

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Matthew J. Kisner and Andrew Youpa (eds.), Essays on Spinoza's Ethical Theory, Oxford University Press, 2014, 284pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199657537.

Reviewed by Charlie Huenemann, Utah State University


This volume presents a cohesive and engaging set of essays, all converging upon the significant question: was Spinoza frowning or smiling? That is, as Spinoza surveyed the wide range of human moral phenomena, did he merely bemoan our superstitious beliefs and ignorant behaviors? Or did he manage to see some of it as truly virtuous? But how can anything be virtuous, if all human actions are completely and thoroughly determined by an infinite substance that really doesn't give a damn what happens?

We might single out Charles Jarrett's essay ("Spinozistic Constructivism") as forcefully presenting the challenges faced by anyone wishing to find genuine morality in Spinoza's philosophy. As Jarrett reads him -- and he reads him quite closely -- Spinoza left himself no room to construct a meaningful "ideal" of human behavior. We will always act as we are determined to act, regardless of whether those actions lead to our own advantage. We can construct for ourselves any number of imaginary ideals, but none of them will do us any good. Indeed, "good" itself is misleading, as Spinoza "advocates or recommends that we take a perspective from which good and evil cannot be conceived. He thus seems to be committed to, and to advocate, a transcendence of ethics" (84).

Several essays take up Jarrett's challenge. Steven Nadler ("The Lives of Others") argues that there is space in Spinoza's system for enlightened self-interest to hold sway over our actions, and Spinoza held that such egoism in fact leads to a life of familiar virtues -- though set upon a radically unconventional base. Michael Rosenthal ("Politics and Ethics in Spinoza") answers Jarrett by incorporating Spinoza's political theory: the state coaches our self-interest into a social arena, where we must factor in the welfare of our neighbors. Jon Miller ("Spinoza on the Life According to Nature") usefully aligns Spinoza with a tradition, both ancient and modern, that understands a good life to be the one aligned with the general course of nature and our nature. Inevitably, there will be obstacles and disasters, but under reason's guidance we can discern a way of life appropriate to our cosmic circumstances.

Some of the contributions are concerned with saving the possibility of Spinoza's morality from other doctrines Spinoza espoused. Michael LeBuffe ("Necessity and the Commands of Reason in the Ethics") bravely confronts the apparent tension between necessitarianism and the intent to give moral advice. Karolina Hübner ("Spinoza on Being Human and Human Perfection") rescues meaningful discourse about humanity as a whole in the face of Spinoza's explicit disdain for universals. Eugene Marshall ("Man is a God to Man: How Humans can be Adequate Causes") defends the intelligibility of saying, within the confines of Spinoza's determinism, that some actions can indeed be autonomous and hence "free".

Some of the essays should be praised for providing broad and masterful perspective. They present broader meditations on the nature and significance of Spinoza's ethical project. John Carriero ("The Ethics in Spinoza's Ethics") thoughtfully explores Spinoza's departure from Aristotle, the scholastics, and traditional religious philosophies. Susan James ("Spinoza, the Body, and the Good Life") builds a sympathetic portrayal of Spinoza's project beginning with the first sentence: "The best kind of life for human beings, Spinoza argues, is one in which we are powerful enough to ensure that we live joyfully and resist sadness" (143). Nicely put. Justin Steinberg ("Following a Recta Ratio Vivendi") looks to the practicality of Spinoza's moral advice. Like many others in the early modern period, Spinoza offered a rough and ready set of rules for right living, a set of general instructions for crossing a stormy sea.

A final trio of essays instructively connects Spinoza's morality with the claims regarding "eternity" in Part V of the Ethics. These are especially welcome, as Spinoza's mystical claims are sometimes treated as an embarrassment or as a separate island of befuddlement. Olli Koistinen ("Desire and Good in Spinoza") incorporates the eternity of the mind into Spinoza's account of motivational structure in order to show that not everything we do is an outcome of pushing and pulling. Sanem Soyarslan ("From Ordinary Life to Blessedness") vividly describes a ladder of ascent from bodily images to the eternity of the mind. Valtteri Viljanen ("Spinoza on Virtue and Eternity") argues that our experience of eternity is not merely a kind of philosophical icing on the cake of the good life; it is rather an essential culmination of the moral guidance and practice Spinoza has carefully set out over the course of the entire Ethics.

The editors and contributors should be congratulated in assembling such a neatly overlapping and connected assembly of original essays. Really, there is not a single clunker in the lot. Moreover, the introduction by Matthew Kisner and Andrew Youpa is a thoughtful overview of the terrain that also provides a useful integration of the chapters that follow. If you are studying Spinoza's ethical theory, you need this book.

I will conclude not with a complaint, but with a brief homily on our practice as historians of philosophy. Like a great many articles published in our journals, some of these essays adopt a variation of what Jonathan Bennett promoted as "the collegial approach" to the history of philosophy. In this approach we treat the Great Ones as our contemporaries and hold them accountable in the same way as we would our colleagues. The special variation often employed today is to take it as given that the Great Ones can be defended against any alleged confusions, incoherencies, or lapses. As a result, we publish many essays and articles that cleverly defend the Great Ones against problems and objections that not only never entered their heads, but probably could never have entered their heads, given their time and place and the normal constraints operating on any human being trying to do philosophy. In truth, no one can think things through as thoroughly as many of us would like to believe. Sometimes, even a Spinoza or a Leibniz nods. It is an odd thing to do, these daring rescues of the Great Ones. I sometimes wonder whether, as we read and interpret, we ought to recall more frequently the familiar limits of history and human capacity.