Essays on the History of Ethics

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Michael Slote, Essays on the History of Ethics, Oxford UP, 2010, 165 pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195391558.

Reviewed by Richard H. Dees, University of Rochester



Michael Slote is best known for his efforts to develop an ethics of care, but in this book he takes a detour into the history of ethics to explore some country lanes running near his main road. The result is an eclectic mix that is less a series of essays in the history of ethics than the intelligent musing of an ethicist while reading historical primary sources. Nevertheless, Slote’s reflections offer some real insights, sometimes into the philosophers he considers, but more often into the nature of moral thought in general.

Slote arranges the essays chronologically by the philosopher under discussion, for no other reason than there is no other overarching theme to the book. So Slote winds his way through Greek ethics, Chinese ethics, Hume, Kant, utilitarianism, and the ethics of care. But he also includes a very personal history of twentieth-century ethics that offers a unique perspective and is simultaneously quite touching.

Slote’s essays on the Greeks (chs. 1-3) advance three ideas: “elevationism,” teleology, and the differences between ancient and modern thought. Of teleology, Slote claims that it is no longer a viable thesis since its modern successor, consequentialism, does not accept a key component of the view: the goal for which we must self-consciously aim. Slote’s distinction here is fine, but I think it an open question to what degree non-modern consequentialists really thought that we had to aim consciously at the telos. On the differences between ancient and modern ethics, Slote focuses neither on the modern tendency to rely on guilt rather than shame as the central moral emotion nor on the modern emphasis on individualism. Instead, he thinks the difference lies in what Sidgwick called the “duality of practical reason”: the difference between what is best for individuals and what is best for everyone. The ancients, Slote claims, did not see a deep distinction between prudence and morality, while moderns do. But again, this distinction is less important than Slote thinks. While the ancients were intent to show that being moral was in everyone’s best interest, they too saw the tension: Book I of the Republic makes no sense unless ordinary people thought that justice often conflicted with their own self-interest.

Much more interesting is Slote’s idea of “elevationism,” which he proposes as the opposite of reductionism. If reductionist theories try to explain higher ethical concepts in terms of lower ones like well-being and then try to explain well-being in terms of natural properties like pleasure, then elevationist theories try to explain lower concepts by means of higher ones. So, for example, the Stoics saw well-being and personal good only in terms of virtues that they might exhibit. But Stoicism, Slote notes, is deeply unintuitive because it does not see ordinary pleasures as part of our good or pains as evils. By contrast, Kant is a dualist, so that well-being and virtue are different and can not be reduced into each other, with well-being representing a kind of sensibility and virtue a kind of understanding. But Slote does not think we are forced to this kind of dualism, and he wants to explore alternatives for elevationism. Aristotle finds that pleasures gained through injustice do the person no good, and so he thinks pleasures require a participation in virtue. But, Slote argues, Aristotle implausibly claims that pleasures obtained through a vice are no part of a good, so that stolen food can not contribute to his good. For that reason, Slote thinks the most promising elevationist is Plato, who argues that a pleasure is good as long as a virtue in exhibited in the course of the enjoyment. So relationships are good because they require a concern for others, achievement is good because it requires perseverance, and wisdom is good because it requires courage. Appetites, to be good, then, require limitations, and they must be properly ordered before they can be a genuine good. The details of Slote’s characterization of Platonic elevationism need not concern us here, except to note that Slote’s interpretation, while inherently sketchy, offers a new way to look at the project of ethics. He does not convince me — or even himself, I think — that we should adopt elevationism as a theory, but he makes it sound both plausible and attractive.

The middle of Slote’s set of essays focuses on the most prominent precursor to Slote’s own form of sentimentalism: Hume. After a brief foray into Chinese ethics in a review of Bryan van Norden’s book that argues for an affinity between important Chinese thinkers and Aristotle that Slote think would be better compared to Hume (ch. 4), Slote offers two substantive essays about Hume’s moral theory that seek to show both why Hume’s view is generally correct and what needs to be done to make it better. In “Hume on Approval” (ch. 5), Slote defends a notion of moral approval and disapproval that is suggested by Hume by showing how such approvals are possible without presupposing moral judgments. The answer, according to both Hume and Slote, lies in empathy. For Hume, approval is a feeling that arises when we empathize with the pleasures of other people, at least insofar as it has been corrected to take out our own relationships so that we can have a common moral language. But this view, Slote claims, does not enable us to exclude our response to inanimate objects that cause harm to humans. Hume’s reply that the feeling is simply phenomenologically different is, Slote rightly notes, inadequate — even if Hume’s defenders can, with some effort, construct other ways to make the distinction. But Slote also claims that Hume’s view that the approvals are always pleasant feelings is wrong because we can give a grudging and phenomenologically unpleasant approval to a worthy opponent. On this point, Slote is just mistaken: Hume agrees that as agents, we do not feel pleasure at the approval to our archenemy, but the approval consists only in the pleasure we have when contemplating our opponent’s achievements from a certain “general” point of view.

According to Slote, Hume’s main problem is that he lacks a way to focus our approvals on moral agents. What he needs, Slote says drawing on his own book, The Ethics of Care and Empathy, is to focus on “agential empathy” (68): “we empathize … ”“>with what they as (potential) agents are feeling and/or desiring; and such empathy is the core or basis of moral approval and disapproval” (68). Moral approval, then, is based on the positive feelings we have when we empathize with an agent who shows empathy for others; it is, then, “empathy with [the standpoint of] ”“>agents” (68). We approve of those who empathize with others and disapprove of those who do not. His view is based on what he calls the “empathy-understanding hypotheses”: “the idea that empathy enters into our understanding and making of genuine moral claims” (83). Such a view avoids Hume’s problem, Slote argues, because we can not empathize with the response of inanimate objects to others. In addition, Slote thinks this moves helps avoids the most important of the standard criticisms of sentimentalism: the claim that it is circular, because the feelings of approval themselves depend on moral judgments. To answer it, sentimentalists need to be able to say what counts as positive and negative features in their own terms. They must be able to argue that someone with empathy will be moved toward the kinds of actions that others will empathize with, and that tendency constitutes the positive aspect of it. Slote suggests that this empathy can account for our intuitive judgments that favor harms that are more visible to us and for those that correspond to our deontological judgments. It also explains why morality is inherently motivating, because the empathy involved in morality automatically carries some motivational weight, and it explains why moral judgments are asymmetrical about self and others, because we do not empathize with ourselves in the same way that we do with others.

However, this schema does not, by itself, solve the circularity problem. On Slote’s view, we are supposed to get a “chill” (78) when we empathize with an agent who responds cruelly to others. But when we empathize with the sadist, we could equally feel the pleasure, so Slote must give us reason to prioritize the feelings of the sadist’s victims over those of the sadist himself. Hume tries to solve the problem by having us empathize with everyone that an agent potentially affects, with a special emphasis on those who are in the agent’s “narrow circle” — and Hume thinks we can make that judgment based just on the tendency of the agent’s disposition, whether or not his cruelty causes actual harm. But Hume seems to be counting on numbers here: the agent’s cruelty is likely to have bad effects on enough people to outweigh his own pleasure. Slote’s view can do better only if he can give a more convincing account of the priority we give to the objects of cruelty. This concern does not constitute a fatal objection to sentimentalism, but it needs something more than Slote offers here to answer it.

A different circularity problem is explored in Slote’s second essay on Hume, “Hume on the Artificial Virtues” (ch. 6) Hume’s problem with justice is that he wants to accommodate our deontological intuitions in the way we treat justice as something inflexible, while staying true to his sentimentalism. But that account is threatened with circularity, Slote claims, because Hume thinks the artificial virtues are motivated by our sense of obligation, but morality itself is supposed to be grounded in the moral goodness of the motivations. Previous attempts to get Hume out of the circle focus on our natural sentiments for self-interest or for the public interest, and so it must show that our rigid attitude is required to get the benefit. The artifice is then just a means to achieving justice, but does not itself provide a justification. The problem is that justice sometimes requires us to go against our self-interest or even against the public interest, and so the rigidity can only be sustained, Slote argues, by an ignorance about the real effects of a few deviations from simple rules. But even so, the account does not, Slote claims, explain why we would morally approve of the rigidity in situations in which we are better served by breaking those rules. So Slote concludes that Hume’s account of justice, as valuable as it is, ultimately fails.

What Slote misses in his criticisms of Hume’s account is precisely the social nature of the conventions that are the basis of the artificial virtues. We can have exceptions to rules about promise keeping, as Slote acknowledges, only when the exceptions are themselves general rules. But for artificial virtues, those exceptions must themselves become socially recognized as exceptions or the social utility of the institutions will be undermined. There must be a rule or a process that allows the exception. Such an attitude does not reduce the exceptions to “whatever produces utility,” since many instances that might increase utility cannot be set out in rules that people could actually use.

Slote’s last essay on the modern period is one cheer for Kant (ch. 7). Even anti-Kantians like himself, Slote claims, must recognize three important notions first found in Kant: (1) the categorical nature of moral claims, (2) the distinction between what is good for a person and what is a good state of affairs, and (3) the inward character of morality, the idea that moral assessments depend only on an agent’s intentions, keeping in mind that agents are obliged to take due care to see that their intentions are fulfilled. Slote is not mistaken to emphasize these points in Kant, but he puts too much weight on Kant’s originality, mostly because Slote simply ignores the religious background to all of these positions. Kant’s true originality lies in the account of autonomy that Slote finds misguided.

In the last three essays, Slote comes to terms with more recent history. In two essays, he wants us to rethink the history of ethics. In “Reconfiguring Utilitarianism” (ch. 8), he notes that while we used to regard utilitarianism as a truncated version of common-sense morality that needed justification, we now see common-sense morality as a complex view compared to utilitarianism that must now itself be justified. The irony, he thinks, is that this turnabout came because neo-Kantians like Rawls tried to provide a justification for the deontological constraints of common-sense morality, and so those constraints were no longer accepted as self-evident. In “Carol Gilligan and the History of Ethics” (ch. 10), he shows that Gilligan’s work on the different voices of ethics helps us to see the importance of some previously-neglected trends in the history of ethics, like Christian agapism as well as the British sentimentalists. This new history is also a deeper one, he thinks, since it gives a larger role to the story of how we can come to adopt an ethics that does not clash with our sense of ourselves in ordinary human terms.

The penultimate essay (ch. 9) is the most personal. Through a discussion of the influences on his own philosophical thought, Slote gives a history of late-twentieth century ethics: how Thomas Nagel and Derek Parfit taught him the importance of theory, how Bernard Williams and Michael Stocker added human and humane touches to morality and showed that a good life is not about following rules, and how Carol Gilligan and Nel Noddings opened his eyes to feminism and to different ways of seeing ethics. But he holds up two different philosophers as his most important influences: John Rawls, who, besides offering the most important contributions to ethics in the twentieth century, also made the practice of normative ethics respectable again; and Philippa Foot, whom he regards as the most incisive philosopher he has known and whose central insight - that our values cannot simply be arbitrary - is now so widely accepted that her influence has become invisible.1 The chapter is a fitting end to the collection, and the fact that it is not the actual end is a testament to Slote’s own desire to pay tribute to the different voices found in Gilligan’s work and to which his own work owes so much.

1 Rawls’s influence is too well-known to add any more, but I will add something to Slote’s remarks about Foot. I met her as a graduate student at a party in her honor after a lecture, and a couple of us began to probe her thoughts about the classic issues about whether an unjust person could be happy. As we talked, others at the party gradually joined the conversation, until everyone present was literally sitting at her feet as she engaged us all in a magnificently Socratic dialogue.