Essays on the History of Moral Philosophy

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J.B. Schneewind, Essays on the History of Moral Philosophy, Oxford UP, 2010, 447pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199576678.

Reviewed by T.H. Irwin, University of Oxford


Readers of Jerome Schneewind's major works on the history of moral philosophy will be pleased to see this selection from his essays. While some of them are well known, others will be unfamiliar to many readers. The essays are ordered in sections that correspond approximately to different phases of Schneewind's work. The four main sections are 'Victorian Matters' (Part II), 'On the Historiography of Moral Philosophy' (Part III), 'Seventeenth- and Eighteenth-Century Moral Philosophy' (Part IV), and 'On Kant' (Part V).

Part II includes an illuminating essay ('Moral problems and moral philosophy in the Victorian period') that represents Schneewind's interest in literature and its philosophical aspects. It is a useful supplement to his early work Backgrounds of English Victorian Literature (1970).

Readers will also benefit from the full list of Schneewind's publications, which shows how much has been omitted from this volume. Some of the omitted items have been largely absorbed in The Invention of Autonomy, but many of them deserve attention in their own right. I especially missed the important essays on Pufendorf.

It would be difficult for a review to summarize these elegant and instructive essays. And it would be difficult to pick out some essays for discussion, since most of them, including the most important, raise questions that are examined at greater length in Schneewind's two long books. But a reader of these essays may be encouraged to reflect on some themes that recur in many of the essays and on the approach and assumptions that guide the author's approach to the history of ethics.

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In his preface Schneewind mentions his extended reflexion on, and confrontation with, the work of Alasdair MacIntyre. One of his earlier publications is a favourable review of MacIntyre's Short History of Ethics, and some of the points that he selects for praise and for criticism in MacIntyre point to some of the characteristics of Schneewind's work. On the one hand, he praises MacIntyre's exposition of different philosophers in relation to their social and historical circumstances; this method of exposition has been a hallmark of Schneewind's work as well. On the other hand, he criticizes MacIntyre for excessive attention to Greek ethics, and, in keeping with this criticism, his own work has always displayed markedly limited sympathy for the Greek moralists. On these points Schneewind's attitude remains stable in his later work. The Augustinian and Thomist developments in MacIntyre's later work correspond to nothing in Schneewind's later development.

But if Schneewind's outlook is stable on these points, it also seems to have developed in other ways. He certainly places Sidgwick in his historical context, and specifically in the philosophical and theological controversies of Victorian England. But the historical conclusions are not used to cast any doubt on the timeless philosophical significance of Sidgwick's utilitarianism. On the contrary, Schneewind expounds Sidgwick sympathetically, and defends him against some of his early critics. We get the impression that Sidgwick is worth reading partly because he offers a detailed statement and defence of a version of utilitarianism that a moral philosopher ought to take seriously. Nor does Schneewind express any doubts about Sidgwick's firmly objectivist views in meta-ethics.

Similarly, Schneewind does not dissent from Sidgwick's views on the history of ethics. Sidgwick holds a timeless view in so far as he takes the views of past moralists to be open to evaluation as attempts to grasp truths about ethics that are not relative to a particular society or historical situation. According to Sidgwick, we can trace in the history of ethics the main methods of ethics that he discusses in Methods, and reflexion on the views of past philosophers will reveal the inadequacy of the methods he rejects and the superiority of the method he accepts. This interpretation of the history of ethics underlies both Sidgwick's Methods and his Short History of Ethics.

One might, then, reasonably suppose that Schneewind's book on Sidgwick shares Sidgwick's approach to the history of ethics. Schneewind examines the controversies among Sidgwick's immediate predecessors, whom Sidgwick does not usually confront directly. He argues that Sidgwick's contribution to these controversies marks an advance on the work of Whewell and others. On this point Schneewind defends Sidgwick's view of his place in the history of ethics.

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In some ways the outlook of The Invention of Autonomy is similar. Here Kant replaces Sidgwick as the central figure, and Kant's moral philosophy is the decisive advance in the history of ethics.

According to Barbeyrac, Grotius marked the age 'where in the science of morality was, if I may so say, raised again from the dead'. This is an exaggeration of Schneewind's view of Grotius, but it corresponds approximately to the narrative of Invention, with some important differences. In Schneewind's view, moral philosophy was alive, but imprisoned by the theologians, until Grotius released it (Invention 82). Grotius was the starting-point for Pufendorf's reflexions on natural law, and Pufendorf 'raised questions that Kant eventually thought he had to answer' (175).

In this respect Kant completes the process initiated by Grotius. The Grotian version of natural-law theory is relevant to a situation in which we have to 'handle serious disagreements among equals' (200). An Aristotelian theory is irrelevant or unhelpful in this sort of situation because 'it must treat disagreement with the virtuous agent as showing a flaw of character', and because 'it encourages each … to impugn the character of the other rather than listen to the other's case' (200).

It is reasonable for Schneewind to make Kant the central figure of his history; for he believes that 'his [sc. Kant's] conception of morality as autonomy provides a better place to start working out a contemporary philosophical understanding of morality than anything we can get from other past philosophers' (Invention xiv). Just as Sidgwick answers the questions raised by his 18th-and 19th-century predecessors, Kant answers the questions raised in the 17th and 18th centuries.

Apparently, then, Schneewind's treatments of Sidgwick and Kant express the same conviction about moral philosophy as a progressive discipline. His two long books seem to present two periods in the history of ethics as periods of philosophical progress. They might also appear to reflect some change of mind about what counts as genuine progress; for the judgment that I quoted about Kant suggests that Kant is superior to Sidgwick, and that some of Schneewind's earlier judgments on Sidgwick might need to be revised.

But at any rate this conception of the progressive character of moral philosophy is not alien to Sidgwick. We might, therefore, expect Schneewind's conception of the history of moral philosophy to reveal agreement with Sidgwick.

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This, however, is not exactly what we find. The essays on historiography are intended to cast doubt on 'the supposition that there is enough significant continuity in the concerns of moral philosophers to warrant discussions of progress and regress in the discipline' (107). Supporters of this supposition are said to believe in a 'single aim' of moral philosophers throughout history. In opposition to the belief in a single aim Schneewind maintains that Aristotle, Sidgwick, the Stoics, Hobbes, Bentham, and Parfit have different aims (120-1). He argues that these different aims make it futile to treat the Socratic question 'How should one live?' as a sufficiently determinate statement of the single aim of moral philosophy (120).

Schneewind is right to say that the aims of moral philosophers have differed. But people who have different aims can also share a single aim. Different members of a football team may have different aims, if they play the game for different reasons, but they still play the same game, with its constitutive aims, and their playing can be evaluated without reference to their ulterior reasons for playing it.

But even if Schneewind were to concede this point, he would still not be satisfied, because he has a further objection to a single-aim outlook:

The historian will have a further problem with this outlook. It implies that since we and past moral philosophers share aims and goals, the best way to understand the work of our predecessors is to look at them in the light of our own view of the truth about morality … The historian will complain that insistence on describing the views of past thinkers in our own terminology forces us into anachronism. If we are interested in what our predecessors were doing and thinking, we must try to understand them in terms they themselves had available. (121-2)

Schneewind seems to argue, on behalf of the 'historian', that a single-aim outlook encourages truth-based evaluation of past philosophers (i.e., evaluation in the light of our views of the truth about morality), and that truth-based evaluation is necessarily anachronistic.

This complaint of the 'historian' is difficult to understand. Perhaps Schneewind wants to remind us that we should, among other things, try to understand our predecessors in their own terms. But that reminder does not conflict with understanding through truth-based evaluation. The attitude of the 'historian' conflicts with truth-based evaluation only if it claims that the only legitimate way to understand our predecessors is to use their own terms.

Such a claim, however, is implausible. If Nepalese climbers in 1500 climbed to the top of Mount Everest, they reached the summit of the highest mountain in the world. This is a true statement of their achievement whether or not they knew or believed that this was the highest mountain in the world. We might judge them remarkably skilful climbers; the truth of this judgment would not depend on whether they thought of themselves as climbers. Similarly, it is difficult to see why we cannot legitimately attribute an achievement to past philosophers who did not consciously aim at achieving that result.

Schneewind explains his objections to anachronism by remarking truly that we cannot suppose Hume intended to anticipate Bentham, or that he intended to formulate a rule-utilitarian theory of justice. It does not follow, however, that he did not achieve these results.

Schneewind has a further defence of the 'historian'. Though he concedes that we may legitimately describe Hume with reference to his achievements, he observes that such a description is not history:

We may have good reasons for thinking of his theory in terms like these, but we are not, in so doing, giving an historical account of it. Worse, we may be overlooking its historical distinctiveness by forcing it into our own molds. (122)

This seems a rather arbitrarily narrow use of 'historical'. If we say that the attitude of Britain and the USA to the Peace of Versailles aided the rise of the Nazi Party in Germany, we are not saying that anyone in Britain and the USA intended to aid the rise of the Nazi Party; but what we say may still be true or worth discussing, and we would not be surprised to see such a statement in a history of the 1920s.

It is difficult, therefore, to see why historians of philosophy should impose on themselves a restriction that other historians do not accept. If they did accept it, their histories would be less interesting. If Schneewind simply intends to stipulate a sense for 'historical' here, without reference to the practice of historians, his point is more trivial than he seems to intend.

The warning in the second sentence of the quotation is reasonable. We may miss something about Hume if we do not think about his intentions. But it seems excessive to abstain from asking a reasonable question about achievements simply because questions about intentions are also reasonable.

Perhaps Schneewind does not mean to reject truth-based evaluation of achievements, but only means to supplement it with inquiries into intentions. But this moderate interpretation of his claims seems to leave out something that he wants to say. For he seems to doubt the legitimacy of truth-based evaluation, not just the preoccupation with it to the exclusion of other reasonable questions.

His attitude is explicable if he believes that the necessary conditions for reasonable truth-based evaluation do not obtain -- if, in other words, he believes either that there are no moral truths or that we have no cognitive access to them. Does he hold this nihilist or sceptical view?

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Perhaps Schneewind's views on this question have developed. The early paper reprinted here ('Moral knowledge and moral principles') shows no trace of nihilism. Nor does he question Sidgwick's objectivism. But his later sympathetic treatment of Kant expounds Kant from a nihilist point of view. If Kant did not discover that rational agents are free, a Kantian about morality should not hold it to be true that we are autonomous. Autonomy was invented, not discovered, because the conception of rational agents as autonomous does not correspond to any fact about them.

If the Kantian conception is not true, why does it provide the best place to start working out a contemporary philosophical understanding of morality? The answer depends on the function and use of moral theories.

We will look at the enterprise of rationally examining norms and virtues as one of the tools that various societies have used to cope with different problems they faced in shaping or preserving or extending a common understanding of the terms on which their members could live with one another. (126)

The use of this particular tool expresses the hope that 'we can reformulate the problems in more manageable ways' (126; cf. 294).

This managerial and instrumental approach gives us no reason to be interested in the truth of moral doctrines and theories, unless we believe that their truth is likely to affect their managerial function. If moral fictions are at least as useful as moral truths in 'coping' and 'managing', we can ignore questions of truth. We will simply prefer Kant to other moralists because we find that his views about moral knowledge fit the anti-elitist outlook that we prefer.

If we look back at Schneewind's objections to a single-aim conception of the history of ethics, we may ask how his managerial outlook escapes these objections. He rejects truth-based evaluation of philosophers' achievements on the ground that it goes beyond the reconstruction of philosophers' intentions, and therefore does not give a 'historical account'. But his preference for the reconstruction of their intentions relies on his managerial approach; if we look at their intentions, we can see what 'problems' they and their contemporaries were 'managing' or 'coping with', and how successfully they were doing it.

This is puzzling, for two reasons: (1) Schneewind seems to agree after all that evaluation of philosophers' achievements, and not simply the reconstruction of their intentions, is a legitimate task for a historian. He objects to truth-based evaluations, but not to evaluations of degrees of managerial success; (2) he believes that the managerial approach to moral philosophy justifies attention to the aims and intentions of past philosophers. But it seems to give only a partial justification. Even if we are not Marxists, we might suppose that some philosophers' aims and intentions give a very imperfect idea of the problems they were trying (not necessarily consciously trying) to solve. If our study of the history of ethics were guided by a managerial approach, it would not easily justify Schneewind's preferred method.

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Would a history of ethics that consistently reflected the managerial approach be better than the sort of history that Schneewind has offered us? I doubt it. Schneewind does not explicate the relevant notions of 'coping' and 'managing', and one may doubt whether they could be explicated enough to do useful theoretical work.

Should we, for instance, regard the French Revolution as a case of 'coping' and 'managing' (perhaps by managing to get the king out of the way), or as a sign of 'failure to cope'? Our answer might determine whether the outlook of the Enlightenment helped or hindered in the 'management' of problems faced by the Ancien RĂ©gime.

These sorts of questions have arisen about efforts to offer a functionalist and relativist account of morality. The difficulty of answering such questions has cast reasonable doubt on these efforts. Until we answer the questions, we cannot say whether morality or moral philosophy is plausibly regarded as a 'tool' for 'coping' or 'managing'.

I rather doubt whether an affirmative and non-trivial answer could be made convincing. One might present Hobbes's outlook as a tool for coping and managing England in the 1640s and 1650s. But many of his contemporaries disagreed with this view; since they took Hobbesian views to be contrary to the preservation of social life. Similarly, someone might regard Price's rationalist conception of rights as a tool for coping with the tensions in late 18th-century Britain, but Burke has plenty to say on the other side. Who is right in these disputes? Both Hobbes and Price may hold views that tend to manage some things and undermine others, and it may be difficult to say whether the overall effect of their views is to manage or to undermine.

But even if one could answer these questions, I doubt whether the answers should matter to historians of ethics. I doubt whether success or failure as a managerial tool tells us anything about the character of moral philosophy, or about what makes one theory better than another. The actual managerial or undermining effect of a moral doctrine depends on, inter alia, who believes it, how far they act on it, what the other historical circumstances are, and so on. There is no reason why some historians should not ask these questions. When I say that they do not matter to historians of ethics, I mean that we can ask some important questions about Hobbes or Price that do not depend on who else believed them, or on how far their views were put into practice, or who opposed them. Questions about managerial effects are questions in intellectual and social history that Schneewind does not ask. He has no reason to ask them. If he had asked them, he would have written much longer books, but he might have not given any better answers to the questions he has actually asked.

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These reflexions may raise a question about Schneewind's contention that we cannot write a history of moral philosophy 'without having some philosophical idea of the aims of the discipline' (122). A historian's conception of the discipline will no doubt influence the selection and presentation of questions and answers. But it is not so clear to me that an idea of the aims of the discipline is so important, or that it will necessarily determine one's approach to the history of the discipline. If Schneewind had consistently selected and organized his historical inquiries so as to fit a managerial conception of morality or moral philosophy, the unsatisfactory aspects of that conception would have become clear.

Probably, then, we should be pleased that Schneewind's later views on the nature and point of moral philosophy have not wholly pervaded his account of past moral philosophers. His two long books and his essays are unrivalled in their combination of narrative skill, historical learning, and philosophical intelligence. Both the philosopher and the intellectual historian can learn from these books and essays. Even if Schneewind does not believe moral theories can be true, and even if he holds a purely managerial conception of moral philosophy, he none the less gives us an illuminating account of philosophers who disagree with him on both points. I rather doubt whether his account would have been more illuminating if it had been more thoroughly informed by his later philosophical views.