Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man

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Reid, Thomas, Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man, edited by Brookes, Derek R., introduction by Haakonssen, Knud, Penn State Press, 2002, 666pp, $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 0271022361.

Reviewed by Philip de Bary, Thoemmes Press


Thomas Reid (1710-1796) is the latest of the great Enlightenment philosophers to be done the honor of a full new critical edition of his writings. Until recently, anyone who wanted to read the writings of the founder of the Scottish School of Common Sense (and for most of the twentieth century there weren’t very many who did) had usually to read them in Sir William Hamilton’s edition, The Works of Thomas Reid (1st edn 1846; 8th edn 1880). But the 1980s and 90s saw a major revival of interest in Reid: The Reid Project was set up at Aberdeen University where most of his manuscripts are housed, and regular international conferences began to take place there; a journal devoted to Reid was established and the book-length secondary literature on him expanded. A ten-volume scholarly edition of primary texts – The Edinburgh Edition of Thomas Reid – was projected under the general editorship of Knud Haakonssen; the first volume, Thomas Reid on the Animate Creation (ed. Paul Wood) appeared in 1995 and the second, An Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense (ed. Derek R. Brookes) in 1997. Five years later we now have Reid’s Essays on the Intellectual Powers of Man (EIPM) and The Correspondence of Thomas Reid (ed. Paul Wood). The remaining volumes in the series are due out at roughly one-year intervals until 2007.

Penn State Press’s dust jacket on the American version of this latest installment of the Edinburgh Edition describes EIPM as “Thomas Reid’s greatest work”, and many Reid scholars will agree that it is. (Those whose primary interest is in Reid’s ethics rather than his epistemology must wait for the Edinburgh Essays on the Active Powers of Man, expected 2005). As the Preface to this edition explains, these two sets of Essays were systematic writings-up by Reid in his retirement of the lecture notes he had developed over long years of teaching at the University of Glasgow. In his earlier Inquiry Reid had set out his anti-skeptical account of perception in sections dealing with the five senses in turn. Twenty-one years later in EIPM sense perception is just one of the Intellectual Powers to which he devotes an Essay, the others being memory, conception, abstraction, judgment, reasoning and taste. Reid’s broad aim throughout this body of work is two-fold: negatively, to demolish the claims of “the ideal theory” in all these domains, and positively to establish a “philosophy of common sense” which lacks its skeptical consequences for knowledge and morality.

There was only one edition of EIPM published during Reid’s lifetime, in 1785. This was what Sir William Hamilton called “the only authentic edition”, and it is the text that forms the basis for that part of The Works of Thomas Reid in all its printings. The same 1785 edition has been chosen by Derek R. Brookes as the basis for his critical text, which is said to diverge from the first edition “only by correction of typographical errors…[which are]…few and marked in the footnotes.” These corrections have been made in the light of Reid’s manuscript lecture notes which, we are told, “often exist in several – in some cases five – different versions of which only a few are dated” (Preface, vi). The Haakonssen/Brookes edition will no doubt be reviewed elsewhere by those with expert knowledge of Reidian manuscripts and textual history. What follows here is meant mainly as a preview – a notice of what to expect for those who, like the present writer, know EIPM through Hamilton, but who haven’t yet set eyes on its new edition in the Edinburgh series.

What we have here, then, is a two-page Preface by both editors, a five-page Introduction by Haakonssen, a corrected and reset first edition of EIPM with annotations jointly by Brookes and Haakonssen, a fifteen-page transcription of manuscript material for three unpublished lectures by Reid ‘on the Nature and Duration of the Soul’, and name and subject indexes prepared by Åsa Söderman.

At once it should be said how pleasurable it is to read Reid’s words in this new typography. One needed young person’s eyesight and bright light in order to read the tiny print of the Hamilton edition without a magnifying glass. If the Hamilton edition had a virtue, it was perhaps that its biblical double columns made the lengthy EIPM quite easy to find one’s way around – navigation is relatively simple when an entire chapter is disclosed by turning a page or two. But the compensating advantages of the Edinburgh format are great. It is anyway fitting that the work of a philosopher whose relevance to present-day debate is increasingly recognized be dignified by uncluttered modern layout. But more specifically the line numbers on every page of this new text give Reid scholars something very useful that they have never had before.

The other most noticeable difference for those accustomed to Hamilton is that the Edinburgh edition has far fewer footnotes. Hamilton was a heavy annotator (especially of Essays I to IV of EIPM), and sometimes his footnotes, for all their formidable learning, read like parodies of scholarly persnicketiness. On the whole they have not been popular with Reid scholars. Ronald E. Beanblossom, for example, said in his note to the abridgement that he co-edited with Keith Lehrer that “while Hamilton’s critical and expository footnotes may be of historical interest, they are generally based upon a misinterpretation of Reid and are primarily a vehicle for presenting Hamilton’s views” (Thomas Reid’s Inquiry and Essays, Hackett, 1983, lxi). While this judgment may be a little harsh, it’s certainly true that the sheer frequency of Hamilton’s interjections (“this is not strictly correct”, “this is a singular misapprehension”) is distracting. At the same time it’s true that when the crotchety baronet keeps quiet on a point, that silence is some evidence that Reid is on good ground in what he has just asserted – or at least that his assertion was uncontroversial in the mid-nineteenth century.

Brookes and Haakonssen have deliberately gone to the opposite extreme with their footnotes. “Reid engages in such detail with a large number of other thinkers that a full annotation of his references would drown out his own text. The guiding principles have been specificity and obscurity … first reasonably specific references, especially quotations, and secondly more obscure references” (Preface, vii). The result, by my reckoning, is that something over half the pages are without any notes. The remainder have a sprinkling of what are usually simple page references to early and to standard modern editions of Locke, Berkeley, Hume and others, and to the best English translations of such as Arnauld and Malebranche (though not, curiously, of Descartes – in his case we’re referred to Adam and Tannery rather than Cottingham et al.). Occasionally a departure from the 1785 edition is noted and a reference made to Reid’s manuscript, but seldom is there any Hamiltonian attempt to correct or comment on what Reid has said in the text above. This editorial restraint is surely welcome. Reid is here being allowed to speak for himself directly to his twenty-first-century readers, as a writer of his unusual clarity can well be trusted to do.

The volume ends with a transcription of the manuscript evidence for three hitherto unpublished “Lectures on the Nature and Duration of the Soul.” In these fifteen uneven pages Reid addresses the questions (a) whether the soul (or “mind” – he uses the terms interchangeably) is immaterial, (b) whether it “has an ubi or place”, and (c) whether there is reason to think it perishes at death (to which his respective answers are ‘yes’, ‘we can’t be sure’, and ‘no’). For the first two questions there are only Reid’s very sketchy lecture notes; for the third there is what seems to be a full-length script.

An editorial note says of these lectures “it is not clear why they were omitted [by Reid] from the Intellectual Powers” (p. 616). This is a point worth pondering. Reid’s psycho-physical dualism pervades the writings published in his lifetime as a background assumption, only coming to the foreground in occasional polemical flourishes like that at EIPM p. 87, ll. 38-39: “There is indeed nothing more ridiculous than to imagine that any motion or modification of matter should produce thought.” To find Reid argumentatively supporting his dualism we have had to turn to his unpublished papers – or rather to some papers that were unpublished until 1995 when Paul Wood included them in Thomas Reid on the Animate Creation. There Reid attacks Joseph Priestley’s materialism by defending the doctrine of the passivity of matter, but he doesn’t put forward any positive arguments for the immateriality of the mind (see Alan Tapper, “Reid and Priestley on Method and the Mind”, Philosophical Quarterly 52, no 209, Oct. 2002, 511-525). The interesting thing about these lecture notes now appended to EIPM is that we can see Reid advancing exactly such positive arguments – or at least prompting himself on how to examine such arguments in front of his student audience. From the bare headings given, it is evident that Reid took his Pneumatiks classes through Samuel Clarke’s version of the Cartesian ‘divisibility’ argument, through various objections to it (from Collins, Martinus Scriblerus and Hume) and through replies to those objections. Reid also lists two other arguments that sound more as if they are his own: one is “from the Power of the Soul to begin Motion or Stop it”; the other starts from the observation that mental powers “appear so immensely superior to the known Properties of Body” (617, ll. 18-19). That this superiority is specifically moral superiority becomes clear later when Reid says: “These Powers or feelings by which we are most nearly connected with Matter appear plainly to be the Meanner and more Ignoble parts of our frame” (619, ll. 33-35).

Why Reid never wrote up the notes for this lecture or the next (about the soul’s location) is a mystery – perhaps he did and the manuscripts simply don’t survive. And whether he wrote them up or not, why he didn’t incorporate the complete third lecture (about the soul’s survival after death) into EIPM is, as the editor says, unclear. Could Reid have felt he had nothing importantly new to say in these areas? Might he have thought there was nothing he needed to say, the truth of dualism being self-evident? (This last speculation raises various other tricky problems: on the one hand Reid doesn’t include a principle speaking for dualism in his list of self-evident “first principles of common sense”; on the other hand, something’s being self-evident doesn’t in general stop Reid talking about it). At all events the publication of these manuscripts opens up new areas of debate, and further unpublished material – some of it germane to EIPM – is promised as a supplement to the new critical edition of the Essays on the Active Powers. The Edinburgh edition is building into a magnificent series, and Thomas Reid’s present and future readers have every reason to be grateful to its editors.