Essays on the Philosophy of Henry of Ghent

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Roland J. Teske, SJ, Essays on the Philosophy of Henry of Ghent, Marquette University Press, 2012, 275pp., $29.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780874628135.

Reviewed by Pasquale Porro, Università degli Studi di Bari Aldo Moro


This is a collection of eleven essays on different aspects of Henry of Ghent's philosophy, nine previously published (between 1996 and 2011) and two previously unpublished (chapters 10 and 11 on, respectively, apophatic theology and analogy). Each begins with a few introductory lines detailing the circumstances under which Teske wrote it -- a smart solution since it avoids the impression of a simple juxtaposition of writings, which together cover a period of almost 20 years. Henry of Ghent was the most authoritative and original master of theology at the University of Paris in the last quarter of the 13th century (in the period between Thomas Aquinas and John Duns Scotus). Teske's lasting interest in Henry has its origins in an encounter with Raymond Macken, the late initiator of the critical edition of Henry's works. That interest is also attested to by his English translations of various questions from the Summa and the Quodlibeta of the Flemish master.1

In the first essay, Teske focuses on Henry's rejection of the universal validity of the Aristotelian principle according to which everything that moves is moved by another. In order to defend the active and autonomous character of the will Henry restricts the applicability of the principle to material beings. The development of the topic -- which is without doubt one of Henry's most characteristic -- is traced by Teske with great precision throughout the whole quodlibetal production. He rightly emphasises the fact that for Henry the will is not moved, in the strict sense of the word, either by the good represented by the intellect or (unless in the most general sense) by God himself, contrary to what Aquinas, for instance, maintained on the basis of De bona fortuna. Following Macken, Teske does not characterise Henry as a radical voluntarist, in that for him the intellect remains a concomitant cause (sine qua non) of voluntary acts. However, one might point to the absence of references to the general coordinates of the debate between voluntarists and intellectualists, in particular, to the positions of Godfrey of Fontaines and Giles of Rome and to the famous propositio magistralis conceded to Giles by the Parisian Theologians (non est malitia in voluntate, nisi sit error in ratione). These elements would have allowed Teske to give a more adequate account of Henry's arguments (Godfrey of Fontaines is mentioned only in a few footnotes).

This chapter can be linked with the one on free will (chapter 9). The most noteworthy aspect here is Teske's decision not to separate Henry's treatment of divine will from that of human will (even though divine will does not tend toward an external goal). The three fundamental aspects of Henry's philosophy of the will and freedom are summed up by Teske as follows: "that the will is a higher power than the intellect, that the will is moved to its act by nothing else, and that the will is a power that virtually contains its act" (p. 214).

Three of the essays are on Henry's proofs of God's existence. The first of these (chapter 2) is in linked, at least in part, to the problem of the self-motion of the will: that the will is not moved by another effectively invalidates one of the presuppositions on which the Aristotelian demonstration of the existence of one or more unmoved movers is based (precisely the principle that everything that moves is moved by another). Teske shows clearly that for Henry the Aristotelian argument does not completely succeed in demonstrating the unicity of God, which is anchored only in the factual unity of the world. Therefore, Henry prefers to make use of the Avicennian arguments which prove the absolute unicity of the necesse esse. Notwithstanding this and other differences, Henry always displays his supreme mastery of Aristotelian thought. One could say, as Teske does (following Pegis), that "his knowledge of Aristotle in the realm of the Philosopher's theology corresponds better . . . to the Aristotle of history than the Aristotle we find in Aquinas" (p. 63).

The other two studies (chapters 3 and 6) reconstruct the metaphysical proof of God's existence put forward by Henry in the Summa, and highlight its proximity, in spite of appearances, to Anselm's argument: it is true that God's existence is not self-evident by nature; however, it can be discerned by a rational investigation from the concept of divine quiddity, which is obtained by abstracting from the most general concepts, such as being, good, one, and by removing all that entails a creatural limitation. By contrast, Teske pays less attention to the epistemological structure of Aristotle's Posterior Analytics, which, as Stephen D. Dumont demonstrated some time ago, constitutes the true framework of the section dedicated to the demonstration of God's existence in Henry's Summa.

Another group of three essays focuses on the relationship between Henry and his two principal sources: Avicenna and Augustine. With respect to Avicenna, in chapter 5 Teske isolates three principal themes which Henry seems to borrow from the Persian philosopher: the decision to assign the proof of God's existence to metaphysics, and not physics; the argument, mentioned above, concerning God's unicity, and the notion of an intentional distinction between being and essence. In chapter 4 Teske also  explores the idea of the intentional distinction: the "distinction between two concepts of the same thing, one of which does not include the other" (p. 114). He finds that the principal indication of the distance between Henry's and Aquinas' metaphysics is provided by their respective understandings of the distinction.

In discussing the relationship between Henry and Augustine (chapters 7 and 8), Teske again chooses to concentrate on three principal aspects: the rejection of Academic scepticism; the idea that the 'sincere' truth of a thing consists in its conformity to the divine exemplar on the basis of which it was created; the possibility of devising a metaphysical proof of God's existence based on the confluence of some Avicennian motives and the Augustinian principle (De Trin., VIII, 3, 4) according to which it is possible to arrive, through removal, starting from partial and limited kinds of goodness, at the unparticipated and subsisting good that is God. Teske titles chapter 8 "An Augustinian Enigma". The 'enigma' referred to regards precisely this aspect: the procedure of removal/abstraction seems to function perfectly within a Platonic and Neoplatonic framework, in which the Forms are present in an integral way in the things that participate in them, but it is more problematic in Henry. For Henry excludes, on the basis of his doctrine of analogy, any form of actual commonality between God and his creatures (and thus, in our case, between divine and creatural goodness).

The same difficulty provides the background for the final two (previously unpublished) essays (chapters 10 and 11), which constitute perhaps the book's most philosophically interesting segment. In the first, Teske reconstructs with great subtlety Henry's essentially negative approach to divine attributes -- an approach inspired by Pseudo-Dionysius and Moses Maimonides, but ultimately based on an accurate consideration of the distinction between the reality signified by a given name and the character of its imposition. Now, as Teske observes, this highly marked choice in favour of apophaticism, and thus of the equivocation of divine names, seems to conflict with Henry's own doctrine of analogy. Indeed, Henry seems to hesitate here, because on the one hand, he maintains that there does not exist a single concept that is really common to God and his creatures, while on the other, he claims that God is the first object of the human intellect insofar as He is confusedly understood in the concept of being, which is itself the first concept known by the intellect. This initial confusion seems to be rooted in the intellect's initial inability to distinguish between being that is indeterminate by negation (i.e., being which excludes any kind of determination, namely God) and being that is indeterminate by privation (i.e., being considered at the most general or universal level, which in no way excludes all its possible determinations). Without this confusion, the proof of God's existence mentioned above would not even be feasible. Without a concept that is in some way common, it would not be possible to move from this or that particular good to the self-subsisting good, i.e., God. Thus, is one forced to concede that for Henry the human possibility for attaining knowledge of God in this life is based on an error of the intellect?

In the last chapter Teske attempts to solve this question. He bases his approach on Martin Pickavé's interpretation.2 Now, Pickavé is certainly right in pointing out that the 'error' of the intellect (i.e., the failure to distinguish between being which is indeterminate by negation and being which is indeterminate by privation) is introduced by Henry not to establish the analogy of being, but to justify the psychological origin of univocity, (i.e., of the Platonising tendency to posit being as a genus). He is equally right in reminding us that for Henry analogy does not have a psychological origin, but is based on a relation of exemplary and efficient causality, which binds together creator and creation. Nevertheless, for both Pickavé and Teske, the intellect's capacity to distinguish adequately between divine and creatural being, excluding any form of commonality between them, presupposes, as an initial phase, a confused knowledge in which divine being is not yet recognised as such, i.e., knowledge of a being without knowing initially whether it is created or not. The transition from confused to distinct knowledge (through the procedure of removal/abstraction) is thus, for Pickavé and Teske, something different from the error of the intellect, which Henry attributes to the upholders of univocity.

However, as attested by Duns Scotus in dist. 3 of the first book of the Ordinatio, this circumvents rather than solves the difficulty: every concept, no matter how confused, originates from phantasms, and phantasms transmit only what can be perceived by the senses. The only phantasms that are at the disposal of the human intellect thus refer to being, which is indeterminate by privation (creatural being), from which it is impossible to obtain through abstraction the concept of being which is indeterminate by negation (God). The error of the intellect, which Henry attributes to the upholders of univocity or to the Platonists in art. 21 of the Summa, ultimately seems to be (in art. 24) the only ray of hope for bridging the gap between two distinct concepts (to use again Scotus' argument, two absolutely distinct and primary concepts can never present themselves as being the same in a confused way).

In conclusion, Teske's book is characterised by its undeniable clarity of exposition in rendering perspicuous highly complex arguments and distinctions and by its capacity to explain with acumen the most interesting aspects of Henry of Ghent's philosophy. However, it would have been useful to consider Henry's thinking less in isolation, to place him in relation especially to contemporary masters (Giles of Rome, Godfrey of Fontaines, Richard of Mediavilla). Henry never ceased to confront them himself, to differ or to enter into dialogue with them and, as a consequence, sometimes to modify his own position. Adding this dimension would have made it easier for the reader to better understand some of Henry's theoretical choices. It would also have been useful to explore more directly what Henry attributed to his sources, especially to Avicenna.

Finally, a few minor but recurring inaccuracies have to be noted: Carlos Steel, for instance, is cited throughout the volume (bibliography and index of names included) as Carlos Steele, and some Latin quotations or expressions are not always rendered accurately. It is a bit surprising, in particular, that throughout the volume Henry's Summa quaestionum ordinariarum is constantly referred to as Summa quaestionum ordinarium [sic]. This is a not infrequent slip in other texts too, but it seems advisable to point it out, because the future of the study of medieval philosophy must be built on the fundamental correctness of the Latin language. Nevertheless, such minor inaccuracies do not in any way undermine the value of a book that can be recommended to all who are studying not only Henry of Ghent but 13th century Scholasticism in general.

1 Quodlibetal Questions on Free Will, Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 1993; Henry of Ghent's Summa. The Questions on God's Existence and Essence [Articles 21-24], Leuven: Peeters, 2005 [translation begun by J. Decorte]; Henry of Ghent: Quodlibetal Questions on Moral Problems, Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 2005; Henry of Ghent's Summa. The Questions on God's Unity and Simplicity [Articles 25-30], Leuven: Peeters, 2006; Henry of Ghent's Summa of Ordinary Questions. Article One: On the Possibility of Knowledge, South Bend: St. Augustine's Press, 2008; Henry of Ghent's Summa of Ordinary Questions. Article One: On the Possibility of Knowledge, Milwaukee: Marquette University Press, 2011.

2 Heinrich von Gent über Metaphysik als erste Wissenschaft. Studien zu einem Metaphysikentwurf aus dem letzten Viertel des 13. Jahrhunderts, Leiden -- Boston: Brill, 2007.