Essential History: Jacques Derrida and the Development of Deconstruction

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Joshua Kates, Essential History: Jacques Derrida and the Development of Deconstruction, Northwestern University Press, 2005, 352pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0810123274.

Reviewed by Diane Enns, McMaster University


Joshua Kates introduces this book as a "radical reappraisal" of Jacques Derrida's work, undertaken in the attempt to maintain Derrida studies as a viable field of scholarly inquiry. Dividing Derrida interpretation into two camps -- one focused on language, characterizing deconstruction as a radical form of skepticism, the other maintaining the traditional authority of philosophy despite the doubt expressed in Derrida's talk of impossibility -- Kates complains that "a single, comprehensive outcome" has not been forthcoming, leaving unanswered the question of whether Derrida is a friend of reason or the most radical of skeptics. Essential History is written to correct this rift by returning to the phenomenological ground of Derrida's work, rooted in his analyses of Husserl and Heidegger. For anyone who agrees with Kates that Derrida's projects are currently reified and immobilized, and who believes, as the author does, that Derrida's thought should be brought "more within the mainstream of Anglo-American philosophical discourse from which it even today remains largely excluded" (36), this book may provide a useful and welcome scholarly exploration of Derrida's early work and of the debates on his analyses of Husserl. For others, Kates' preoccupation with tracing a development in Derrida's thought concerning his approach to phenomenology that no one has previously acknowledged, that brings us closest to Derrida's own intention, and that promises to "revitalize" and legitimize Derrida's thought to readers unconvinced by the value of his work, Essential History may not be a philosophically inspiring read.

The book consists of six chapters, the first of which provides an overview of the debate between Richard Rorty and those whom Kates calls Derrida's "quasi-transcendental interpreters," namely, Rodolphe Gasché and Geoff Bennington. He returns to this debate to show how the controversy concerning the value and legitimacy of Derrida's work originates in problems found in Derrida's own thought. Kates makes explicit that such an analysis requires the discovery of a single problem or occasion that motivated the invention of deconstruction as a whole. This occasion is to be found in Husserl's phenomenological account of philosophy, to which, Kates adamantly argues, Derrida has "always subscribed." Thus, according to Kates, Husserl's philosophy alone stands at the root of Derrida's own conception of philosophy's work (31).

The second chapter follows from this claim, exploring the current status of the debate on Derrida's relationship to Husserl's phenomenology. Here we find another impossible impasse that Kates promises to negotiate, between Husserl scholars unfamiliar with Derrida's work, and readers of Derrida who do not know Husserl's work. This impasse -- centered on Derrida's 1967 work on Husserl, Speech and Phenomena -- Kates believes permits the first glimpse of a true development in Derrida's early writings that has thus far been overlooked. That Derrida is ambiguous about his own development is clear, Kates argues -- despite the interpretations to the contrary -- in several retrospective statements by Derrida in which he specifies that to go beyond Husserl would require "thinking 'the unthought axiomatic of Husserl's thought'" (xxii).

Whether Derrida indeed thinks this "unthought axiomatic" is the subject of chapter three. Kates' purpose is "to arrive at a definitive resolution of the issue of development in Derrida's early thought" (xxii) and with some excitement, he demonstrates that such a development does in fact take place between Derrida's ideas on writing in his 1962 "Introduction" to Husserl's Origin of Geometry, and the 1967 texts. Taking us through a labyrinthine discussion of this early interpretation of writing and truth, focusing particularly on section 7 of the "Introduction," Kates shows that in 1962 Derrida recognized Husserl's breakthrough regarding writing and glimpsed within it an inconsistency. In section 7, in fact, Derrida comes to an impasse -- the inability to get beyond Husserl's insights -- and this impasse, Kates argues, proves to be the unparalleled motivating instance for the invention of deconstruction (66); a motivation arising from the recognition of both the necessity of thinking a new, unprecedented functioning of writing and language, and the impossibility of doing so within existing means.

Chapter four, "The Development of Deconstruction as a Whole and the Role of Le problème de la genèse dans la philosophie de Husserl," makes the case that Derrida's concerns with genesis and the real in this 1954 text largely disappear in his mature work, which Kates explains is the result of Derrida's engagement with Heidegger. There is also, however, a radical foreshadowing of his later thought, namely a strategy of deferral -- philosophy must be given authentic recognition; its rupture must however be postponed; yet such a postponement is the condition of possibility of the radical questioning of philosophy. The chapter concludes by elaborating more precisely the argument of Essential History. Derrida's intentions as a whole in the 1967 works are twofold: to mount "a new, more general thought of writing and language" and to rethink Husserl's transcendental attitude, expanding it at the same time as he questions Husserl's notion of a world origin, demonstrating how it is implicated in a movement and history in part foreign to Husserl himself (114).

With this new knowledge of Derrida's development, Kates claims that we can read the 1967 texts more precisely, taking into account their differences and similarities, strengths and weaknesses; a reading he attempts in the final two chapters. Chapter five turns to Speech and Phenomena, outlining the structure of the text as a whole; describing it as a text in movement that shifts from a marginal interest of Husserl's back to the center of phenomenology and on to what Derrida believes to be a radical outside -- a thought beyond both Husserl's thought and the totality to which it pertains (xxvi). Kates dwells on chapter six of the text, expounding on the meaning of la voix or the phenomenological voice that allows sense to stay close to itself even as it passes beyond itself while remaining a phenomenon. It is this voice that deconstructs Husserl's thought, and provides the only example of the function of différance here, and later of the archi-writing that Derrida conceptualizes. Kates remarks again that these conclusions demonstrate that even as Derrida radically departs from Husserl's thought, in Speech and Phenomena he never finally dispenses with him (156).

In the final chapter of Essential History, Kates responds to what he considers to be another failure in Derrida scholarship: the realization by readers of Of Grammatology that Saussure's linguistics is foreign to any transcendental concerns. This is at the heart of the "incoherence" Kates believes characterizes the reception of Derrida as well as Derrida's work itself, manifest in the dissonance between an empirical outlook and a transcendental standpoint (xxiii). Here, finally, Kates leads us to the part of his overall argument -- what he calls the last piece of the puzzle -- regarding Derrida's changing position on history between 1962 and 1967, and his move towards Heidegger. This is attributed to Derrida's intention to reconcile Husserl and Heidegger, repeating Le problème's project this time with respect to history rather than genesis. Yet, according to Kates, Derrida now denies the teleology of Husserl's transcendental history, which he supported in 1962. Kates spends an inordinate amount of time getting us to this place, at the expense of a more detailed explanation of the development he believes has such profound implications for how we read Derrida, particularly with respect to Derrida's relationship to Heidegger, which is only sketchily addressed in this chapter.

In the end, Kates makes a cursory gesture towards the host of Derrida's other themes and topics -- politics, ethics "and similar themes" -- by briefly exploring Derrida's famous engagements with Foucault ("Cogito and the History of Madness") and Levinas ("Violence and Metaphysics"). In these works, Kates sees more of Husserl's "essential history" or "history of essences" than has previously been acknowledged pointing to a "subterranean" but exemplary significance that this project had in all Derrida's subsequent work. This final gesture in Essential History proves to Kates that although provocative and important, these topics of politics and ethics "can only ever be addressed on the far side of a singular rapprochement of this history with Heidegger's epochal intentions" (xxix).

I am always suspicious of the author who attempts a definitive reading of a thinker that breaks through all previous impasses and problematics. This sort of attempt risks solidifying the positions of previous debates, lumping critics into this or that category, or constructing a "straw-man" argument. Kates exemplifies this in his criticisms of the already numerous commentaries on Derrida's early texts and his engagement with Husserl, often in his extensive footnotes. Len Lawlor's Derrida and Husserl: The Basic Problem of Phenomenology (2002) for example, makes frequent appearances in Kates' notes, as embodying one of "the standard versions of deconstruction." (220). Lawlor, according to Kates, in a sense preaches to the converted, and therefore does not take notice of the substantial objections raised against Derrida's readings by informed Husserlians (220). Ironically, neither does Kates in any explicit manner. Unless we have read these critics -- he names Willard, Hopkins, Mohanty, and Evans -- we must take his word for granted that Essential History is informed by or responds to these Husserlians. It seems then, that Kates also preaches to the converted; this book is probably far more important and interesting for those who already read Derrida's work through Husserl and want to find in Derrida a "system," than it is for those of us who read Derrida precisely because we enjoy a philosopher who remains uneasy with fixed positions.

Equally suspect is the constant allusion to the intentions of the philosopher in question, and to providing an interpretation that is closest to him, closer than previous critics have achieved. Are these exercises required in order to legitimate Derrida for an Anglo-American philosophical audience, as Kates expressly wishes to do? For this reader, these concerns merely strip Derrida's work of its lively and radical provocations, reducing it to a series of dense arguments and subtle shifts in logic. So-called definitive readings have a habit of foreclosing philosophical questions, and for Kates to propose a conclusive and determinative reading of Derrida in particular -- or criticize an approach for not being "genuinely Derridean" -- when this enigmatic thinker's work and themes harp on the impossibility and undesirability of determinative readings in general, will be disappointing for some readers. We can acknowledge Husserl's importance for Derrida and read Derrida's work as a whole -- and Essential History is certainly valuable in both of these regards -- without suggesting that Derrida's engagement with his first master is the singular lens through which we must read his work in its entirety.