Eternal God/Saving Time

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George Pattison, Eternal God/Saving Time, Oxford University Press, 2015, 355pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198724162.

Reviewed by Bernard Prusak, King's College, Pennsylvania


It is a staple of theistic prayer and study to call God "the Eternal." The attribute serves as a title of praise. But what does it mean to call God "eternal"? What sense, if any, can be made of it? Does it mean that God is timeless or that God endures without end (that is, is sempiternal)? If God is timeless, as metaphysicians since at least Boethius have been wont to claim, how can we time-bound beings know God, and how for that matter can God know us, really know us, given that time appears to be of our essence? What's more, if God can't really know us, how could God save us, as theists who belong to the world's great religions have traditionally called on God to do? For how could God know what we need saving from -- not least, after all, the ravages of time on mind, body, persons, places?

This big, long book -- densely set on the page, packed with explications de texte -- unfolds against the background of these and similar questions. George Pattison allows that "there seems to be something intuitively right about his [Heidegger's] assertion that 'time is the horizon of the meaning of being,' that is, there is nothing that we human beings can experience and know that is not marked by time" (1). Pattison nonetheless refuses to abandon "the theological category of the eternal" (2), but sets himself the task of trying to think "how time-experience itself might yield the kind of transformation of life that religious believers refer to as 'salvation'" (7). In the terms of the book's title, his inquiry is whether it is possible to conceive of "salvation from time in time -- saving time" (289).

As Pattison acknowledges, his discussion draws freely from "religiously committed sources" (5), not only theologians but also scriptural texts like Exodus and Job. At the same time, he is surely right to insist that this is "also a philosophical work" (5), deeply engaged as it is with both conceptual analysis and figures from across the history of philosophy. The book, which Pattison calls a study, has nine chapters. Somewhat ironically for a book on time, there is static quality to swaths of the discussion. The thread of the argument can be hard to follow through painstaking expositions of Spinoza, Boehme, Hegel, F.H. Bradley, and John McTaggart (chapter 2); Schelling and Nietzsche (chapter 3); Schopenhauer, Heidegger, Kierkegaard, and Barth (chapter 4); Vladimir Jankélévtich, Jean-Louis Chrétien, Emmanuel Lévinas, and Dostoevsky's The Brothers Karamazov (chapter 5); Ernst Bloch, Paul Tillich, N.A. Berdyaev, Jürgen Moltmann, and Jacques Derrida (chapter 6); and finally Michael Theunissen, Kierkegaard again, and Franz Rosenzweig (chapters 7-9). The main action occurs in chapter 1, which is focused on analytic literature from the last 40-plus years, and chapter 8, on Kierkegaard, whom Pattison clearly finds inspiring. If Heidegger's claim that "time is the horizon of the meaning of being" frames Pattison's study, Kierkegaard is the principal figure who, Pattison seems to hold, gives us reason to think that "time's otherwise universal solvent power" need not be the last word (173).

Pattison's argument in chapter 1 is largely critical of what he calls the analytical approach to questions regarding God's eternity: namely, modeling ways of being that could be conceived as elevated above the flux of time (46). He presents two main objections. First, according to him, the analytical approach "does less than justice to what we might call the religious 'interest' in naming God 'the Eternal'" (9). Pattison appeals in this regard to the testimony of Augustine's Confessions: what Augustine wants from God, and why it matters to Augustine that God be eternal, is salvation from "dissolution amid the changing times." For Augustine, God's saving power is premised on God's "elevation above the world of time and change" (13). Metaphysics that does not answer what Pattison calls this "experienced need" to be saved from the ravages of time has lost its existential impetus. Pattison's second main objection is that the analytical approach tends to neglect "the necessary apophatic element in all theology" (10). As he puts this criticism more fully, it is too little remarked in the analytic literature "that 'timelessness' is not actually a divine attribute but a negative concept that says nothing at all about God except that God does not have time in the sense that human beings have time" (42).

This last point -- that "God does not have time in the sense that human beings have time" -- opens the way to Pattison's own project. As he remarks, that God does not have time as we have it does not preclude God's having time "other than time as we know it" (42). There are several possible replies to this statement. One is that it's nonsense. For what sense can we make of time "other than time as we know it"? What meaning can we give to God's being temporal in no way known to us? Another possible reply is to suggest, more reverently, that here speech about God must fall silent. For how can we go on talking about God along these lines without giving the impression that all talk about God is nonsense? Does not speech need to yield here to wordless piety? By contrast, Pattison's answer is to rethink the theological category of the eternal. For him, to call God eternal is no longer to speak of God either as timeless or even as enduring without end. Instead, to call God eternal is precisely to signal the possibility, glimpsed through a glass darkly, that God has time "other than time as we know it."

Pattison needs, of course, to say more in this regard, and in both chapters 1 and 8 he does. (Basically, the intervening chapters gloss alternative accounts of the relationship of time and eternity in modern philosophy.) In chapter 1, reflections on scriptural texts lead him to suggest that "biblical references to God as 'everlasting' say no more than that mortals whose days are 'as grass' . . . have no measure with which to conceive of God's Lordship over time" (35). As he goes on, a lesson of such texts as Job is "that God's time or God's relation to time is beyond all measure." This notion of the immeasurability of divine time starts the gears turning. Pattison suggests that it does the "essential work" that the notion of timelessness was supposed to do, namely, mark a "fundamental difference between divine and human being" by reminding us that God "is temporal -- but not in ways that we can know or measure" (44). In brief, Pattison's idea going forward is "To parse ideas of divine timelessness in terms of the immeasurability of divine time" (45).

What makes God's time, however, "saving time"? How, in other words, does the notion of the immeasurability of divine time itself "do justice" to the religious interest in naming God the Eternal? Truth to tell, Pattison's answer to these questions could be clearer. Pattison excels in interpreting texts from across the history of philosophy, but his own argument proves more difficult both to follow and to fathom.

Here is what chapter 8, on Kierkegaard, seems to suggest. To begin with, our own experience of time attests to its immeasurability. How vast it extends into the past! And how it tumbles ceaselessly from the future into the present! Of course, death will bring the end of our being-here -- another dismal note from Heidegger -- but we are well aware that the future will extend beyond our being-in-the-world. In fact, the future has depths we cannot contemplate, dimensions we cannot begin to measure. Now, what Pattison takes from Kierkegaard is the suggestion that the eternal is "the power that allows us to be fully in time" (266). It is by opening ourselves to time beyond our time, so to speak, that we develop the capacity to extend ourselves over and through time and thereby become constituted as selves properly speaking: the subjects of a life that is not exhausted by but transcends "any particular temporal goal or combination of goals."

An anti-Heideggerian note begins to sound here: it is not by facing death that we come into ourselves; instead, it is by facing up to the immeasurability of time beyond our deaths. From this point of view, the eternal comes to us as a gift, and what's more a gift that "is to be found only in time" (280). Remarkably, then, pace Augustine "we do not need to hold out against time in order to find something that abides in the midst of change." Instead, "The eternal comes to be in time as the other of time, as that which, giving time, shows itself as beyond all measure of time" (284).

How God is supposed to re-enter this picture is a bit puzzling. Reflecting his Christian convictions, Pattison writes movingly of "the possibility of a kind of love and faithfulness that does not pass with the passing of time" (284). Reflecting on the name of God in Exodus 3:14, he presents God as "the one who eternally comes to the aid and comfort of his people"; God's "way of being is precisely to be eternally, that is, ever and again, to be there for [his people] 'to all eternity'" (299). But does our experience of the immeasurability of time give witness that it is God's time? Further, does our experience of the immeasurability of time intimate God's being-there for us at all times?

Pattison closes the book's introduction with the acknowledgment that "this present study is by no means the end of the road" (8). In particular, he writes, "further clarification" is needed "as to how our understanding of the eternal is grounded in the call to love." Further clarification is indeed needed on this point. Here is hoping that his next book goes on to address this need directly, in his own voice, more systematically and less historically.