Are the authoritative teachings of Christian denominations about human life and happiness after death coherent? In his book, Christopher M. Brown takes up the task of defending what the Catholic tradition affirms about the afterlife against charges of incoherence. Not only does Brown defend the coherence of traditional Catholic views on heaven, but Brown’s thesis is that Thomas Aquinas’s views on eternal life and human happiness in heaven offer better solutions to four problems than the solutions provided by some contemporary philosophical theologians.
The first part of Brown’s book lays out in three chapters four problems which seem to arise from a combination of views Catholicism is committed to. The first three problems concern the nature of heaven (abbreviated by Brown as ‘PNH’). PNH-I deals with the problem that neither individualist nor social models of heaven proposed by contemporary philosophical theologians can accommodate everything which the Catholic tradition authoritatively teaches about heavenly life and happiness. According to an individualist model, the perfect happiness of a human being S in heaven merely consists of S’s seeing God, i.e., the beatific vision. A problem with such a view is that it seems to conflict with the biblical idea that a human being’s afterlife is a life in ‘the new heavens and the new earth’. Consequently, according to the biblical testimony, it seems that S’s happiness and eternal life in heaven include more than S’s seeing God. In response to this possible flaw of an individualist model, a social model of heaven states that S’s eternal life and perfect happiness merely consist in a perfect cosmic community which includes a perfect human community S is part of, overseen by a good and gracious God. However, a problem with such an account is that it jeopardizes the idea that God is absolutely perfect and infinitely good, i.e., that S’s seeing God in the beatific vision alone is sufficient for S’s perfect happiness. Brown engages with the work of Germain Grisez and Katherin Rogers to illustrate how contemporary attempts fail to reconcile the models.
The second problem, PNH-II, resurfaces from what the Catholic tradition teaches about the bodily resurrection. On the one hand, authoritative Catholic doctrine affirms that resurrected human beings who enjoy eternal happiness in heaven will possess spiritual, incorruptible, and immortal bodies. On the other hand, it is a Catholic dogma that these resurrected bodies will be numerically identical with the bodies the resurrected had in their earthly life, i.e., bodies that are constantly changing, are corruptible, take up space, etc. But is the latter claim not in conflict with the former? This is conceded by Lynne Rudder Baker who solves this apparent contradiction by giving up the view that resurrected human beings possess human bodies, i.e., bodies which are numerically identical with the bodies they had during their earthly life, and who gets criticized by Brown precisely for this reason.
The third problem, PNH-III, is concerned with the question of whether the life of a human being S in heaven is static or dynamic, i.e., whether S’s heavenly life is a life in which no progress or changes of any kind happen, or a life in which at least some progress or changes occur. Again, it seems that authoritative Catholic teaching about the afterlife is incoherent because the biblical idea of the ‘new heavens and the new earth’ seems to imply that S is embodied and part of a perfect community of embodied human persons from which it follows that S undergoes change in heaven. However, such a dynamic account of S’s eternal life and happiness in heaven seems to conflict with the view that S finally comes to rest and is perfectly happy in virtue of seeing God in the beatific vision. Brown presents and rejects two contemporary attempts to solve PNH-III, Eric Silverman’s totally dynamic view of heavenly life and Paul J. Griffiths’s minimally dynamic view.
Brown calls the fourth and final problem ‘the problem of the tedium of heavenly immortality’ (PTHI). According to the Catholic tradition, a human person S in heaven is immortal and perfectly happy. However, an immortal human life seems like it would be tedious and consequently would not be a perfectly happy life. Brown considers solutions to PTHI which one could formulate relying on work from Timothy Chappell, Gilbert Meilaender, and Griffiths but he ultimately dismisses them as unsatisfactory in light of a recent objection which has been leveled by Brian Ribeiro against such solutions. Ribeiro argues that it might be the case that S’s immortal life in heaven is not boring because whatever S desires in heaven is satisfied by the beatific vision. However, what S in heaven desires seems to be so different from and discontinuous with what any human being in this life desires that S in this life cannot rationally wish to go to heaven because it is impossible for S to go to heaven without ceasing to be numerically identical with him- or herself.
Parts 2 and 3 of Brown’s book are devoted to the task of explaining, developing, and defending what Thomas Aquinas has to say about the nature of heavenly life and eternal happiness. For reasons of space, it is impossible to summarize Brown’s ten-chapter-long magisterial exposition and defense of Aquinas’s views. Instead, I will concentrate on the core idea and structure of Aquinas’s account of eternal happiness as it is presented by Brown.
Brown brings to the reader’s attention that Aquinas distinguishes—in analogy to Aristotle’s distinction between essential and accidental aspects of human happiness in this life—an essential from an accidental component of human happiness in the afterlife, i.e., the ‘essential reward’ from the ‘accidental reward’. The essence of the essential reward is a contemplative union with God which results from an activity of the intellect, namely, the seeing or contemplating the essence of God.
However, the essence of the essential reward—the beatific vision—is not identical with the essential reward. In analogy to Aristotle’s distinction between the essence of a thing and its proper accidents, i.e., its ‘propria’, Aquinas distinguishes the beatific vision as the essence of the essential reward from the proper accidents of the beatific vision. These proper accidents are acts of will or effects of acts of will such as delight, enjoyment, love, charity, joy, peace, benevolence, rightness of will, and praise which are formally caused by the beatific vision and necessarily follow from enjoying the beatific vision. In other words, Aquinas distinguishes the good of a human being S’s contemplative union with God which results from S’s act of seeing or contemplating the essence of God as the essence of the essential reward from goods such as delight, love, or joy etc., which result from acts of will that are formally caused by this union and necessarily accompany it.
In contrast to the essential reward, the accidental reward consists of any good added to the essential reward in a way which is analogous to the way a non-proper accident is added to a thing, namely, as something which is added to something else and is not caused by the principles of the essence of that to which it is added. In other words, the accidental reward consists of any good that is not caused by the essence of the essential component of human happiness, i.e., S’s union with God in the beatific vision, and which is consequently a good that S does not necessarily enjoy in heaven.
Yet, like the essential part of perfect human happiness in heaven, the accidental part has component parts as well. In analogy to Aristotle’s distinction between the inseparable and separable non-proper accidents of a material substance, Aquinas distinguishes between the inseparable and separable accidental goods of perfect human happiness. In Aquinas’s view, inseparable accidental goods of a human being S’s perfect happiness in heaven such as S’s communion with other creatures are goods which are not required for S’s perfect happiness, but S will always possess them if S is perfectly happy. In contrast to the goods which as proper accidents are part of the essential reward, the latter goods do not have God as their object. In turn, separable accidental goods of S’s perfect human happiness such as S’s embodiment are goods which are not required for S’s perfect happiness, and which S does not always possess if S is perfectly happy.
A final important distinction in Aquinas’s account is the distinction between perfect human happiness and the well-being (bene esse) of perfect human happiness. The latter is the essential reward plus the accidental reward, i.e., it is the happiness which a human being S enjoys who enjoys not only the goods necessary for S’s perfect happiness but also the goods fitting or appropriate for S to enjoy given S’s nature. For example, friendship with other creatures is not necessary for S’s perfect happiness in heaven. Nevertheless, since S is by nature a social creature, friendship with other creatures in heaven is part of the well-being of S’s perfect happiness in heaven, i.e., it is a good which is appropriate or fitting for S to enjoy in heaven given S’s nature.
In the fourth and last part of his book, Brown explains in four chapters why Aquinas’s views provide better solutions to the four problems than the views of the authors discussed in the first part. In chapter 14, Brown argues that PNH-I can be solved with the help of Aquinas’s distinctions between the essential and accidental component of perfect human happiness and perfect human happiness and the well-being of perfect human happiness. There is no conflict between the claim that a human being S’s seeing God in the beatific vision is necessary and sufficient for S’s perfect happiness in heaven, and the claim that S’s happiness in heaven includes the reality of a perfect communion with other human and non-human creatures. In Aquinas’s view, the former proposition is true because what is essential for S’s perfect happiness is S’s union with God in the beatific vision alone. However, the latter proposition is also true because the reality of a perfect communion with other human and non-human creatures in the ‘new heavens and the new earth’ is an aspect of the accidental component of S’s happiness. Given S’s nature as a social creature, it is fitting or appropriate for S to enjoy the latter good, i.e., it is a good which is part of the well-being of S’s perfect happiness in heaven.
One would expect PNH-III to be solved in a similar way from a Thomistic point of view: S’s heavenly life is static regarding the essential component part of S’s eternal happiness, i.e., S who enjoys the beatific vision and the goods of delight, joy, and love etc., that follow upon that vision cannot be made happier because S’s perfect happiness and the delight etc., which follows from it cannot be increased or intensified by anything added to it. Yet S’s heavenly life is dynamic insofar as the well-being of S’s perfect happiness includes accidental goods (e.g., embodiment or the direct seeing of loved ones) whose enjoyment involves that S undergoes change in heaven. However, Brown shows that Aquinas would reject the contemporary philosophical assumption which this solution takes for granted, namely, that a dynamic existence requires change, and finds PNH-III to be solved thereby even more elegantly by Aquinas’s views.
Chapter 15 explains how Aquinas’s views on heaven and eternal happiness can help to solve PNH-II. From a Thomistic standpoint, it is not incoherent to affirm that a human being S who enjoys eternal happiness has a spiritual, incorruptible, and immortal body B2, and that B2 is numerically identical with the body B1 that S had before S died and went to heaven, namely, a body that was constantly changing, corruptible, took up space, etc. According to Aquinas, the fact that B1 is corruptible and B2 incorruptible does not imply that B2 is not numerically identical with B1 because B2’s incorruptibility does not indicate that B2 has a different nature from B1. This is because the incorruptibility of B2 is not caused by its nature but by something which is extrinsic to its nature. The incorruptibility of the resurrected body B2 is an intrinsic quality which B2 possesses but B2 does not have this quality in virtue of its nature but due to the power of Christ’s resurrection and S’s soul enjoying a grace conferred by the beatific vision, i.e., causes which are extrinsic to the nature of B2. Thus, although S in heaven has an incorruptible body B2 by some sort of preternatural or supernatural disposition in S’s soul, B2 is in and of itself corruptible. Therefore, a Thomist can respond to Baker’s objection by saying that it does not follow from the different persistence conditions of B2 and B1 that B2 and B1 possess different essential properties because the incorruptibility of B2 is not an essential property of B2, i.e., a property which B2 has in virtue of its nature, but rather an accidental property which B2 has in virtue of the action of God who causes S’s soul to have the intrinsic but preternatural or supernatural disposition to configure prime matter in such a way that a numerically the same but incorruptible body of S comes into existence at the resurrection.
The fourth part concludes with chapter 17 in which Brown formulates a solution to the problem of the tedium of heavenly immortality (PTHI) and argues that it is preferable to the versions discussed in chapter 3 because it is not vulnerable to Ribeiro’s objection. According to Brown, Aquinas’s views on grace, according to which grace does not destroy, but rather, perfects nature, help to rebut PTHI. In a nutshell, the idea is this: God prepares human beings to become fit for heavenly activity by giving them a power called ‘grace’. In other words, God helps human beings with the grace he gives them to gradually transform their psychology or mind and consequently what they desire in such a way that their personal identity is preserved in a process which begins in this life and which most likely is continued in the life to come in most cases, namely, in purgatory. Thus, while it is impossible for a human being S without grace to desire to go to heaven because what S will desire in heaven is fundamentally different from what S desires in this life, it is possible for S with God’s grace to desire in this life to go to heaven because God’s transformative grace prepares S already in this life to desire what S will desire in heaven or at least prepares S to have the desire to desire what S will desire in heaven.
Brown’s book is admirable for its clarity, its argumentative precision, and its capacity to bring Aquinas’s views into a fruitful dialogue with contemporary accounts of heavenly life and eternal human happiness. In a transparent way, the reader is led step by step to the conclusion Brown is arguing for, namely, that Aquinas’s views offer better solutions to the four problems than the solutions provided by some contemporary philosophical theologians.
I have two minor critical remarks concerning Brown’s presentation of Aquinas’s hylomorphism. First, Brown’s way of explaining Aquinas’s account of accidental change is potentially misleading. He writes:
For an accidental change such as Socrates becoming tan, Socrates (a substance) is the subject or matter of the change, and being tan/being non-tan are the accidental forms gained/lost in the change. (111; italics in the original)
However, ‘being non-tan’ is not an accidental form that Socrates loses in the change from white Socrates to tan Socrates. White Socrates is not composed of Socrates and the accidental form of non-tanness. Rather, white Socrates is composed of Socrates and the accidental form of whiteness. What happens when Socrates becomes tan is that he loses the accidental form of whiteness and gains the accidental form of tanness or brownness. Thus, accidental change always involves a privation. Socrates can only acquire the accidental form of tanness or brownness if he is deprived of the accidental form of whiteness. Brown’s account of accidental change might give rise to the wrong impression that Aquinas needs to treat privations as forms to explain accidental change.
My second worry concerns Brown’s presentation of Aquinas’s view on prime matter. Brown writes:
Therefore, the principle of potency in a being that can undergo substantial change is a nonsubstance. St. Thomas calls this principle, a portion of prime matter. The prime matter of a substance that can undergo substantial change explains that that substance is corruptible. (112; italics in the original)
First, designated matter is a portion of prime matter, that is, prime matter with the addition of the accidental form of unterminated quantity under three dimensions. (239; italics in the original)
There are several problems with this way of presenting Aquinas’s ontology of the material world. First, in Aquinas’s view, it makes no sense to speak of ‘portions’ of prime matter because prime matter is pure potentiality for form, i.e., it is matter which is completely formless, and which for this reason is numerically one in all material things (cf. DPN, cap. 2). To have portions of matter, i.e., quantities of matter, which are distinguishable, matter needs to be actual and have forms which belong to the category of quantity (see, e.g., ST, I, q. 75, a. 7, corp.). Thus, in Aquinas’s view, the expression ‘portions of prime matter’ is a contradiction in terms. Second, if a portion of prime matter is designated matter it cannot serve as the principle of potency in a being that can undergo substantial change because, in Aquinas’s view, designated matter does not survive the corruption of the substance of which it is part and consequently cannot serve as the substratum that undergoes substantial change. For example, a human being X’s flesh and bones cannot undergo substantial change but the prime matter that X’s rational soul configures it such that X’s flesh and bones result. Third, it is not the prime matter but the designated matter of a substance which explains why a substance is corruptible or not. According to Aquinas, a heavenly body is not incorruptible due to the prime matter its substantial form configures. Rather, a heavenly body is incorruptible due to the fact that its designated matter is not in potency to being and non-being (see, e.g., In Meta, VII, lect. 16, 1609). In other words, a heavenly body cannot corrupt because matter which has a potency to being and non-being is designated matter which is composed of contrary elements and the designated matter of celestial bodies is not composed of contrary elements (see, e.g., SCG, II, cap. 55; ST, II-II, q. 164, a.1, ad 1). To sum up, Brown’s use of the term ‘portion of prime matter’ is confusing and might lead to misinterpretations of Aquinas’s hylomorphism and the role that prime matter plays in it.
However, even if I am right with these two minor critical comments, they do no damage to Brown’s overall argument. Brown has delivered a philosophical masterpiece which is a must-read for scholars interested in a faithful and accessible reconstruction and explanation of Aquinas’s views on eternal life and human happiness in heaven. Brown convincingly shows that taking Aquinas as a guide in thinking about heaven is rewarding because his view does not raise any of the problems that attend some contemporary accounts.
I am thankful to Christopher M. Brown, Ralf Klein, Bruno Niederbacher, and Olivia Winiger for helpful comments on previous versions of this review