Ethical Intuitionism

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Michael Huemer, Ethical Intuitionism, Palgrave Macmillan, 2006, 309pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 1403989680.

Reviewed by David McNaughton, Florida State University


Michael Huemer's book is a vigorous defense of ethical intuitionism. Since different folks mean different things by this term, I should say that Huemer's conception can be briefly summarized as the view that there are irreducibly normative or evaluative properties which things (states of affairs, events, people, etc.) possess in a manner that is appropriately independent of our beliefs, desires, and attitudes. Some moral truths are known intuitively; that is, non-inferentially, but not through sense-experience. Huemer's book is, in parts, polemical: it is designed to persuade and, in my view, his arguments for his central claim are indeed persuasive. In delivering that verdict, it is only fair to warn the reader that I needed no persuading, being already a convinced ethical intuitionist. It is thus hard for me to judge how it might strike the more skeptical reader who should, of course, read this book for herself.

Huemer's taxonomy of metaethical views bifurcates them into Realism and Anti-Realism. The first category has two subdivisions: Naturalism and Intuitionism; the second has three: Subjectivism, Non-cognitivism, Nihilism. These are, he argues, the only five possibilities. Huemer's strategy is to argue against Intuitionism's main rivals in the first part, and then to expound his favored theory in the second, before meeting possible objections. But if Intuitionism is such a plausible theory, as he and I agree, why has it (until recently) had such a bad press? The book ends with a rousing diatribe against what he regards as the intellectually disreputable reasons for its rejection. I personally found this polemic refreshingly direct.

Let me begin critical evaluation by discussing Huemer's taxonomy. Huemer himself makes the important point that he does not regard the classification with which he starts as the most metaphysically illuminating. The crucial divide is between Dualists, who hold "that there are two fundamentally different kinds of facts (or properties) in the world: evaluative … and non-evaluative" (p. 8) and Monists who think that there are only non-evaluative facts and properties. On this picture, which seems to me wholly right, all the meta-ethical views other than Intuitionism that Huemer considers, including Cornell realism, are fundamentally alike in embracing a Monist worldview. Monists, in this area as in others, can be reductivist or eliminativist. This has the satisfying result that Intuitionism alone is right about the most important issue, and everyone else is wrong. Or, at least, that will be so if Huemer's classification is exhaustive; but is it? The elephant in the room is Kantian constructivism. Kant himself gets one mention in a footnote, and there is no discussion of modern Kantianism. Since this is such a striking omission, it is worth asking where Kantian theories would fit in Huemer's taxonomy. I suspect that he would classify them as subjectivist, which is a fairly broad category for him. Subjectivists "think that for an object to be good is for some person or group to have (or be disposed to have) some psychological attitude or reaction towards it" (p. 48). This category thus embraces, on his view, cultural relativism, ideal observer theory, and divine command theory. I doubt that Kantians would like these bedfellows, but they can speak for themselves.

Huemer devotes one chapter each to disposing of non-cognitivism, subjectivism, and reductivist views, including Naturalist moral realism in the Cornell style. His discussion is usually clear and cogent, and the points are generally well known, so I will not critique it, but it is worth bringing up at this point an issue about the intended audience of this book. Huemer aims to make his book accessible to the well-informed philosophical amateur -- a laudable aim, given the general importance of these issues. However, much of the contemporary discussion in the literature is complex and technical. In order to show that he really has seen off the opposition, Huemer feels obliged to engage with such sophisticated antagonists as Gibbard, Timmons, and Blackburn. These short vignettes are clear, and often illuminating, but necessarily opaque to the general reader. Huemer's solution is to asterisk difficult sections, so that the tyro can skip them. These shifts in level can be disconcerting, though they may be unavoidable. In some cases there might have been better integration between the levels: in the initial statement of each position and objections to it, Huemer may occasionally seem to be attacking positions that are simpler than any that are now actually held. This method of exposition does have one advantage, however, which Huemer employs to good effect. In his view, and in mine, many of the sophisticated variants of these theories are, at bottom, vulnerable to versions of the rather obvious objections that one might raise against simpler statements of the theories. So it is worth having the short sharp refutation on the table even if proponents of the theory might protest that he is attacking a straw person, since the objection that seems too obvious may yet go to the heart of the matter.

The feeling that Huemer may occasionally be giving short shrift to a view about which more might be said could be reinforced by the fact that Huemer covers a great many complex issues -- in metaphysics, epistemology, philosophy of language, philosophical psychology -- in a comparatively brief compass. Some writers might have been inclined to make the book more exhaustive, and exhausting, but -- given his intended audience -- I think Huemer was wise to keep it fairly short. The book would have been better, however, if he had sometimes resisted the temptation to open up difficult topics that he did not have space to explain properly.

Huemer's own positive view is moderately complex. In a lengthy chapter on practical reasons he considers a well-known argument in support of non-cognitivism which appeals to a broadly Humean conception of motivation. Huemer's solution, as I understand it, is to reject the Humean account of normative reasons, and to abandon the claim that only desires can motivate, while retaining moral belief internalism -- the view that moral beliefs can be inherently motivational. The discussion is rather convoluted and sometimes a little hard to follow, but these are muddy waters indeed.

I turn now to his moral epistemology. Many intuitionists, of whom I am one, prefer (like Ross) to eschew the term 'intuition' in expounding the theory, since it can be so misleading. Huemer, however, embraces this terminology, which he introduces via his Principle of Phenomenal Conservatism (PPC) which states, briefly, that "it is reasonable to assume that things are the way they appear" (p. 99). When people say things like 'it seems that p' they are reporting what Huemer calls 'appearances'. These have propositional contents, but they are not beliefs, since -- as in the Muller-Lyer illusion, or the apparent increase of the size of the moon near the horizon -- one can continue to say that things seem to be thus and so even after one knows that they are not. For Huemer, 'appearance' "is a broad category that includes mental states involved in perception, memory, introspection, and intellection" (p. 99). Appearances can deceive, and we may cease to believe that things are as they initially appeared, prior to reasoning, but only on the basis of other appearances, e.g. placing a ruler besides the two lines in the Muller-Lyer illusion.

An initial, intellectual appearance is an 'intuition'. That is, an intuition that p is a state of its seeming to one that p that is not dependent on inference from other beliefs and that results from thinking about p, as opposed to perceiving, remembering, or introspecting. (p. 102)

I note two things about this account. The first is that, on Huemer's view, the class of intuitions covers two disparate groups. The first group consists of general evaluative remarks to which one might appeal in argument, such as 'enjoyment is better than suffering' or 'it is unjust to punish an innocent person'. The second consists of our initial moral responses to particular moral scenarios, such as the trolley cases. Huemer does not, I think, see any difference in the epistemic status of each group. Each can be rejected if reasoning, drawing on further 'appearances', suggests the initial appearance is misleading. Huemer's methodology would thus seem to be that of reflective equilibrium, an approach in ethics that is widely endorsed. He describes this approach as 'foundationalism' because "we are justified in some beliefs without the need for supporting evidence" (p. 120). (He does qualify this in a note, saying that his view more closely resembles Haack's 'foundherentism'.) This terminology could mislead the careless reader. The term foundationalism is, as the name implies, often used to describe theories that have at their base a class of privileged self-evident truths, from which all else is inferred. In ethics, the assumption would be that the base truths would be very general. This is not Huemer's position, as he makes plain on p. 106; his theory does not require that there are any self-evident truths. Indeed, on his view, perhaps no belief is evidentially unchallenged. I agree with him that our beliefs should be deemed innocent until proved guilty, but, as I am sure he would agree, that view does not entail that any belief will be wholly exonerated because no evidence can be found against it.

Huemer's view is thus quite unlike, say, Ross's theory, and it might have been helpful to emphasize that fact more. Indeed, I am not sure whether Huemer appreciates the distance between his view and Ross's. There is a brief but laudatory discussion of Ross on pp. 250-2, but Huemer does not there sharply distinguish between moral knowledge, which Ross thought was confined to our awareness of the fundamental prima facie duties, and Ross's views about moral judgment in particular cases, for which there is no algorithm, but which never amounts to more than probable opinion.

The second thing worthy of note is Huemer's claim that we can extend the range of PPC to cover intellectual intuition. It has been a commonplace, since Chisholm's seminal work, to distinguish two senses of the word 'seems' (or 'looks'). In sense-perception, things can seem or look a certain way, in virtue of their perceptual appearance. We might call this the phenomenal sense. So when the optician asks the patient to say whether the red spot is above or below the green line she is asking how things look to the patient; she is not asking the patient to judge how things are. And in such cases things can continue to look a certain way even when we know they are not (Muller-Lyer illusion; moon near horizon). So that to say that the moon looks bigger need not imply anything about one's being inclined to believe that it is bigger. But there is also a sense of 'seems', which we might call its doxastic sense, in which to say that, for example, a certain arithmetical result seems to be correct, is to be inclined to believe or judge that it is correct. There does not seem anything especially phenomenal about this experience; there is no way that true correct mathematical judgments look. Note also that, were I to come to believe that the answer to the arithmetical problem was incorrect, I would withdraw the claim that it seems correct, since I would no longer be inclined to believe it.

Huemer's Principle of Phenomenal Conservatism is spelled out, as the name suggests, entirely in terms of the phenomenal understanding of 'seems' statements. Now a perceptual report of how things seem -- such as "The lower line looks longer than the upper one" -- may be open, in some contexts, to being interpreted in either way. It might mean that this is how things look perceptually, or it might mean that is what I am inclined to judge; any ambiguity can be dispelled by further questioning. However, in the case of what Huemer calls intellectual intuitions -- such as "It seems that any two points can be joined by a single straight line" (p. 99) -- any attempt to interpret such statements phenomenally rather than doxastically is surely strained. Yet that is just what Huemer does, claiming that we can extend the phenomenal sense to the intellectual realm, so that 'seems' is being used in its phenomenal sense in such statements. One reason for doubting Huemer's interpretation is that, as we have seen, we would withdraw this statement if we came to believe that there were points of which it was false that they could be joined by a straight line. It would seem better, and simpler, in the intellectual case, to interpret 'seems' statements doxastically. Huemer's insistence that intellectual intuitions are not beliefs forces him into the unnecessary complication of explaining how intuitions are related to beliefs.

Huemer draws an implausible analogy between direct realism in sense-perception and awareness of moral truths. I do not infer from my sensory experiences that there is a desk in front of me; rather experience is transparent, so that I 'look through' it to the real objects. The sensory experience partly constitutes our awareness of external things. Similarly, the intuitionist

should be a direct realist about ethics. He should not say that intuition functions as a kind of evidence from which we … infer moral conclusions. He should say that for some moral truths, we need no evidence, since we are directly aware of them, and that awareness takes the form of intuitions; that is, intuitions just partly constitute our awareness of moral facts. Intuitions are not the objects of our awareness when we do moral philosophy; they are just the vehicles of our awareness, which we 'see through' to the moral reality. (pp. 121-2)

Apart from the unnecessary complexity of this view, taking the perceptual model seriously in this way simply encourages those critics of intuitionism who think that it claims that we can detect some strange kind of objects. It would have been much simpler to drop the dualism of appearance and belief and interpret 'seems' statements in the moral realm doxastically. We could then adopt a familiar principle of doxastic conservatism that says that if we are inclined to believe that p, we are justified in so doing, unless countervailing evidence comes to light.

Why does Huemer not go for the simpler solution? He writes:

The point that intuition is often independent of belief is important, since it enables intuition to provide the sort of constraint needed for adjudicating between competing moral theories. If intuition simply followed moral belief, then it could not help us decide which moral beliefs are correct (p. 104).

This argument fails to establish his conclusion. Intuitions, on the simpler view, are what we are inclined to believe, prior to reasoning. Once the process of reflective equilibrium is under way some adjustments will have to be made. So our final beliefs will certainly not match our initial judgments. And what we think of those initial judgments when we later reflect on them may vary. We may cease to have any tendency to believe something we initially found plausible, but there are other possibilities. We may continue to think that a claim has some plausibility, but that overall it is probably false. We may continue to find a claim very attractive, but believe we have an explanation of why we continue to find it attractive, even though we know it to be false. Our intuitions act as constraints on what we come to believe, not because we refuse to relinquish them, but because they are the starting points from which we reason to our final beliefs.

This book has many merits. It is generally clear, well-argued, timely, and thought-provoking. Not the least of its merits, however, is that it contains a large element of truth. Huemer is understandably frustrated that so many people still misrepresent intuitionism and fail to take it seriously. But it is making a return, and currently has more proponents than he sometimes seems to suggest. His book should help create some more.