Ethical Marxism: The Categorical Imperative of Liberation

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Bill Martin, Ethical Marxism: The Categorical Imperative of Liberation, Open Court, 2008, 479pp., $44.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780812696288.

Reviewed by Michael Barber, St. Louis University


Bill Martin seeks to restore to Marxist discourse, characterized often by an economic reductivism and philosophical positivism traceable to Karl Marx himself, neglected or even rejected ethical dimensions that have found a high point of expression in the ethics of Immanuel Kant. This admirable project of restoration recaptures ethical dimensions at least implicit in the work of Marx and more explicit in the early work, insofar as Marx's "fourth" formulation of the categorical imperative, namely to overthrow the conditions that degrade humanity, suggests how his project extends Kant's insights to the political and economic realm. This recovery of ethics also will entail that Marxists must address issues of subjectivity, intentionality, and normativity, which Marx may have thought his systemic analyses rendered irrelevant. It further entails that they must examine what is ethically required beyond simply advancing class interests, particularly of those to be found only in advanced capitalist nations. An ethical Marxism will also oppose any teleology or strict laws for history, in which humanity's goals could be achieved without any free, human effort and in which, as a result, such effort would seem no longer really to matter.

At the same time, because ethics cannot transform society by itself, Martin wants to retain Marx's systemic analyses that begin with a primary focus on production and the commodification of labor, the producer of value. Marx, however, did not appreciate as well as Lenin did how capitalism was expanding globally through the colonial era until it reached its present imperialist status in which those who are competitively advantaged economically employ assorted strategies (including military force) to dominate others, instrumentalize their lives, and acquire resources, cheap labor, and markets. Since for Martin imperialism, with its devastating effects, is the ethical question of our time, he opposes Ronald Aronson's reformist and social-democratic post-Marxist foundationalism in favor of one that is revolutionary and communist.

The labor theory of value keeps its focus on production and especially on those who, working at the basis of the production of wealth, can be taken advantage of and have their needs neglected -- and hence, it already constitutes a kind of ethical approach to economics. But certainly more sophisticated economic investigations, in this ethical line, are called for especially when it comes to global international relationships. Martin himself would certainly support such investigations insofar as he suggests lists of Marxist-inspired themes to be studied and repeatedly calls for strategic and theoretical economic analyses (80, 193-195, 248, 311). It is ethically right, as Martin argues, to aim at the goal of organizing internationally "a form of life that does not depend on exploitation, oppression, and domination (185)," that would in effect overturn the imperialist system, and that would depend on creating, as Mao saw, self-reliant economies, not liable to exploitation. However, one wonders how such a long-range goal can be achieved -- a question of application -- given the great economic imbalances, the predominance of the profit-motive, and the vulnerability of so many dependent economies. For instance, can nations arrive at the kind of cooperative investment agreements that might be needed to develop such self-reliant economies, in such a way that these arrangements would be governed by ethics rather than greed, or will such agreements amount to disadvantageous deals cut with foreign powers that will only prolong inequity and dependence? The ethical comportment of all parties involved, political vigilance, and careful theoretical analyses all seem mandated by a goal which the difficulties of achieving do not cancel -- a point to which Kantian ethics, with its insistence that critical practical rationality not derive its norms from what factually occurs, has always been attuned.

After discussing his proposal for integrating Marxist economic analyses with ethics in the Introduction and Part 1, in Part 2 Martin turns his attention to the sad history and mechanisms of imperialism, the use of military force and its cruelties (e.g., torture and napalm) to advance national self-interest; the urge to forget past wars and their victims; and the ideology that presents one's own nation as supremely good. Martin documents the British interventions in China in the 1830s and the racism underlying Theodore Roosevelt's international adventurism, which William James and an Anti-Imperialist League of businesspersons, politicians, and intellectuals opposed. Martin also criticizes Stalin for subordinating the international struggle for justice to the national defense of the Soviet Union and warns against reductivist attempts to negate the economic system of capitalism that would be a form of mere reaction formation that in the end will undermine the society to come.

The third and by far the largest part of the book deals with Sites and Ramifications: the treatment of animals, places, and Mao. Perhaps one of the most thought-provoking discussions in the book is Martin's discussion of the "animal question," which he states might be a touchstone for the very possibility of ethics. Joining with Colin McGinn, Martin runs through a series of arguments against consuming animals for food, but at times he exhibits a bit of diffidence about such things as whether animal rights can be grounded (205, 208, 257), though he himself thinks that prohibitions against animal consumption are justified. Whatever stance one takes on the question of rights, he rightly insists that this is not the end of the question and that obligations not to treat animals cruelly (because they are sentient) remain. In particular, through repeated poignant descriptions, he makes a convincing case that the present treatment of animals in advanced capitalism, such as amassing them for the duration of their lives in crowded, filthy, massive feeding lots, is immoral. His analysis profits by conjoining animal commodification with that of labor or of those who are oppressed through imperialist machinations insofar as the victims are kept at a distance, out of sight and out of mind. Furthermore, callous indifference to the plight of animals can lead to the hardening of one's heart toward the suffering of oppressed humanity, as Kant also argued when he justified prohibitions of animal cruelty on the basis of the effects such cruelty had on human beings. Though one might argue that without a justification of animal rights the consumption of animals as food would be permitted as long as cruelty is avoided (in their housing and deaths), Martin would argue that such consumption is itself a form of cruelty and that, given the pervasive current systemic subordination of animals to economic purposes, cruelty is unavoidable. Martin's most penetrating critique here is that the sensitivity to the massive, mute suffering of animals, which is required if one wishes to avoid a callous heart, and the solidarity with them, which grows out of and underpins such sensitivity, raises questions that do not allow one to rest in peace after having offered intellectual justifications. As Levinas saw, ethical responsibility continually troubles rationality.

The large third part continues with a discussion of agriculture and the question of place, and it emphasizes the importance of not adopting a simply instrumental attitude toward the dirt and the land, the flora and fauna, natural to a local area. Martin recommends a loving use of land, without "urbancentric contempt," as Wendell Berry and Wes Jackson have advocated, without, however, ignoring concerns for international justice. In a final section in this third part, Martin appeals for a balanced appraisal of the experiments in Marxism in the Soviet Union and Maoist China. He recounts, for instance, China's progress in feeding and clothing its own people, providing universal health care, increasing basic literacy and life expectancy between 1949 and 1975, even as he admits Mao's mistakes. He likewise points to Soviet improvements while criticizing Stalin for refusing to learn from experience and trust the masses, for adopting a "no one can tell me anything attitude" (353), and, above all, for stifling any flow of ideas by executing their proponents. In a final section, he justifies revolutionary violence in those extreme cases where moral judgment fails and protests against the massive violence inflicted by imperialist powers that often goes uncriticized. At the same time, he cautions against revolutionary violence that would become systemic and thereby lose its revolutionary character and against Sartre's tendency to valorize anti-colonial violence as identity-forming.

If one admits that situations of oppression can reach such an extreme point that revolution may be called for and if one does not concur with a position of absolute pacifism, it is still conceivable that before one arrives at those extreme moments where violence becomes necessary political resolution might be possible through groups and individuals coming to free agreement or even compromise, especially when a polity is democratically organized. Indeed, democratic processes can provide precisely the constraint and accountability that political leaders such as Stalin resisted. To be sure, democracy ought not be deployed ideologically as a weapon to attack alternative political forms or as a cloak for imperialistic designs, especially insofar as democratic structures themselves are so susceptible to economic manipulation. There are, of course, those who would argue that socialism itself is a more hospitable environment for democracy, and those who insist on the potential for democratic structures at various levels to enable those who are oppressed to contest the legitimacy of their treatment and so advance the end of a new form of life free of domination. Insofar as Martin rightly understands that Marx's account of functioning economic systems needs supplementation by autonomous functioning moral principles, particularly of a Kantian type that upholds the dignity and autonomy of individuals, some account is also needed of how democratic structures of all sorts can serve to restrain and even direct systematically functioning economic imperatives. Given that democracy does not appear as an index entry in Martin's book and that he seems to set his own Marxist foundationalism against Aronson's social-democratic version and characterizes the latter as "reformist," one wonders about what role he conceives democracy playing within his ethical Marxism or about whether he thinks that democratic processes inevitably lead to reformism rather than revolution. But perhaps this is a subject for another book.

In his Conclusion, Martin explores the questions of meaning and hope that have often been a preoccupation of religion. Having rejected a Marxist teleology of history, Martin holds out the possibility that human beings can care about and love humanity, its possibilities of flourishing, and its possibility of redemption, which human actions play a role in realizing. After providing for the separation of science from religion on the basis of Kant's idea of the irreducibility of vocabularies, Martin rightly takes to task fundamentalist forms of religion, particularly creationists and intelligent design theorists, who deny the autonomy of science and the capacity of humans to investigate this world in its own terms, who actually show themselves hostile and cynical toward human purposes and activities, and who often serve ideological agenda. Because of such representatives of religion, "anyone who cares about making a better world would not want to get within a million miles of that religion stuff" (449). Martin's critique of religion goes even further insofar as he mounts a comprehensive critique of Christian theodicy, which, in league with the Marxist teleology of history, has blithely approached the Shoah as something that can be "used" (and trivialized) for explanations in structural terms (e.g. "everything has a reason") without any regard for its aporeatic element that deserves absolute respect. Martin takes theodicy to be unethical in that it liquidates particularity; renders human action dispensable and so leads to moral-political abdication; justifies evil; issues in a God who, if omnipotent, is monstrous and hateful; denies that there is such a thing as radical evil, some part of which cannot be saved or made good; and ends up reducing humanity to a mere object in a common drama.

In line with the ethical rigor of the entire book, though, Martin finds more appealing less pervasive instances of Christianity and Judaic religion that would emphasize orthopraxy, ethical-political universalism, and taking the side of the poor and the outcast and that has "libertory potential" (447). The ethical God correlative to this ethical religion might correspond to Levinas's God who "declines the desire it arouses while inclining it toward responsibility for the neighbor" (Otherwise than Being, 123). Certainly, such an ethical religion would insist that any attempt to provide a theodicy for the Shoah must be ethically off limits, as Martin too recommends; the ethical responsibility due its victims prohibits making them examples of detached thought-experiments. Nevertheless, one could imagine believers in such an ethical religion reaching a point where it might be necessary, if one is to be philosophically responsible, to show how the very God who orders them to ethical responsibility must not at the same time be guilty of indifference or complicity in the face of the world's evil, unless they are willing to give up their belief in a God who profoundly supports and commands their life's ethical project of serving the other. Such a reflection born out of responsibility for the other and undertaken for the sake of that responsibility, of course, would be constrained by its very origin to seek to avoid the many unethical implications of traditional theodicy that Martin enumerates. There are the efforts in this regard by those who deny divine omniscience while holding to a God who struggles against evil, as, for instance, do process theologians and Gregory Boyd and James Marsh (the latter two of whom Martin sympathetically cites). In addition, there is a whole body of literature in analytic philosophy of religion that defends classical theism by doing such things as circumscribing its exaggerated and careless claims in theodicy or supplementing it with narrative approaches to suffering that take full account of particularity (e.g., the work of Marilyn McCord Adams, Norman Kretzmann, and Eleonore Stump).

In sum, this book is a challenging book, well worth the read. It challenges a long-standing view of Marx, the assumptions and immoral practices of our economic and cultural system, our relationship to animals, our understanding of place and history, and the ways in which we find hope and meaning in a life devoted to doing the right thing for others.