Ethical Sentimentalism: New Perspectives

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Remy Debes and Karsten R. Stueber (eds.), Ethical Sentimentalism: New Perspectives, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 294pp., $99.99, ISBN 9781107089617.

Reviewed by Michael Milona, Auburn University


This volume brings together a collection of articles addressing different aspects of sentimentalism. The basic idea of sentimentalism is that morality is rooted in emotion. In its most uncompromising form, it says that moral metaphysics, moral thought, and moral epistemology are all somehow emotion-based. Among sentimentalists, however, the details vary significantly. In this volume, for example, Jesse Prinz defends the view that moral judgments are constituted by emotion, yet they nevertheless aim for a kind of generality. Prinz's sentimentalism, inspired directly by Hume, stands in contrast to neo-sentimentalism, adopted here by Justin D'Arms and Daniel Jacobson, among others. Neo-sentimentalism is the view that moral judgments are not themselves emotional but are about emotions, namely what merits certain emotional responses. In general, it is a characteristic of the volume that its authors support very different views, even if they are each optimistic about sentimentalism in one way or another.

In fact, the questions taken up by the chapters are highly diverse, and the links between them are often highly abstract. Some of the papers make interventions in ongoing debates, including those about evolutionary debunking (by Karl Schafer), emotional phenomenology (by Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons), and relaxed realism (by Simon Blackburn). Readers will also find a pair of articles on reactive attitudes (by Antti Kauppinen and Michelle Mason) and three articles on empathy (by Remy Debes, Karsten Stueber, and Diana Tietjens Meyers). Several authors turn to figures in the history of philosophy to illuminate positions that haven't been widely appreciated (e.g., David Wong's fascinating contribution on Mencius and Xunzi and Railton's equally excellent piece on Hume). The volume's lack of tight cohesion is not a problem, though; it is a function of the increasing diversity of projects that can be termed 'sentimentalist'. Readers who look closely, however, will discern a question lurking in many of the articles: how to combine an empirically informed, emotion-centric moral psychology with the apparent objectivity and normativity of ethics.

The editors, Debes and Stueber, offer a concise introduction that attempts both to introduce the core ideas of sentimentalism and to explain its emergence in the 17th and 18th centuries. As they see it, sentimentalism arises partly out of a critique of Bernard Mandeville's Fable of the Bees. According to Mandeville, there are no eternal moral truths, and there is no genuine moral motivation. Francis Hutcheson, David Hume, and Adam Smith were equally dissatisfied with a Platonic picture of moral reality. But unlike Mandeville, they held that genuine moral motivation is possible. Hutcheson appealed to benevolence, for example, while Hume and Smith relied on sympathy, or what we today label 'empathy'. The sentimentalists used a deep engagement with moral psychology to present a picture of the objectivity of morality - the way in which moral discourse appears nonrelativistic. Ideas such as Hume's "general point of view" have an important role in such explanations. The sentimentalists also attempted to explain the normativity of morality, though as Debes and Stueber point out, the early sentimentalists' answers here are difficult to pin down. It is important for contemporary sentimentalists to fill in this gap.

On the whole, the introduction is successful. Framing the sentimentalist project as a response to Mandeville is especially helpful. It is typical to see the sentimentalists contrasted only with rationalists such as Samuel Clarke and John Balguy, who took moral truths to be analogous to the eternal truths of mathematics. This latter approach to explaining sentimentalism can risk perpetuating a stereotype that Hutcheson, Hume, and other sentimentalists are subversive of morality. But foregrounding the sentimentalist reaction to Mandeville illustrates their optimistic stance toward human nature, and how they see morality emerging from that picture. One slightly awkward feature of the introduction, however, is the insistence that "First and foremost, ethical sentimentalists are unified by a conviction in the "response-invoking" nature of (at least some) ethical concepts and judgments " (1). This criterion arguably rules out any who believe that moral reality exists independently of our passions. Yet Anthony Ashley Cooper (Shaftesbury), often identified as the first of the sentimentalists, does just this, at least on one interpretation. According to this line, Shaftesbury is a sentimentalist primarily because of his moral epistemology, which takes certain passions to be the foundation of moral knowledge (see Irwin 2008, 353-371). In general, it seems to me that efforts to privilege sentimentalism in certain branches of philosophy but not others is potentially misleading, and in any case unnecessary.

Continuing with the question of how to conceptualize sentimentalism, Michael L. Frazer's opening article, "Interdisciplinary before the Disciplines: Sentimentalism and the Science of Man," is one of the gems of the volume. Both rationalists and sentimentalists want to explain how well human nature and morality fit together. The rationalist approach begins with the nature of morality and afterwards investigates the extent to which human nature and history align with morality. The sentimentalist approach is altogether different. Here Frazer takes J.G. Herder as one of his unlikely, but ultimately compelling, protagonists. According to Herder, sentimentalists should be engaging not only with science, as is typical among its current advocates, but also history. This "socio-psychological" approach is largely "a path not taken in modern scholarship" (28). Frazer is right that Anglo-American sentimentalists should, as a collective, engage more deeply with different cultures and history. This is especially the case if sentimentalists agree with Frazer and Herder that the approach is justified practically and not just theoretically. As Frazer puts it, for the sentimentalist, "Life is short, and human needs are pressing" (25). In turning to Herder, then, we raise grand questions about the point of philosophical ethics. Careful readers will find similar, if subtly different, themes in Simon Blackburn's contribution, "Moral Epistemology for Sentimentalism." Blackburn argues that sentimentalism does a better job than a currently popular realist view ("relaxed" realism) in explaining why ethics matters to us.

It should be noted, however, that the volume leaves out a major tradition (as is nearly inevitable in a medium-sized collection): Franz Brentano, Alexius Meinong, and Max Scheler are key figures in the history of sentimentalism and the philosophy of emotion, each defending unique and important positions. (One can nevertheless find echoes of Brentano among contributors who endorse fitting attitude accounts of value.) Consider Scheler. He maintains that certain affective experiences disclose objective, emotion-independent values, and that moral inquiry is an a priori enterprise. According to Scheler, "Values cannot be created or destroyed" and "They exist independent of the organization of all beings endowed with spirit" (1973, 261). Scheler, similarly to Shaftesbury on one interpretation, accepts a sentimentalist epistemology but not a sentimentalist theory of value. Proponents of this view today include Graham Oddie (2005) and myself (2017), among others.

Those interested in a more "Shaftesburean" sentimentalism will likely find Horgan and Timmons's contribution relevant (as well as the piece by D'Arms and Jacobson discussed below). Horgan and Timmons take up the question of what we can learn from introspection about the nature of sentimental experiences. Their phenomenological inquiry here is incredibly careful, distinguishing between different forms of introspective justification about the nature of one's experience. First, knowledge of one's own experiences gets started by attending carefully to experience itself. But phenomenological claims can also be justified abductively; the best explanation for why one's experience has some feature may be that it also has some additional feature. They argue that introspective inquiry on emotional experience reveals such experiences to have a normative character, one which has, as they put it, an "'objective feel"' (106). But whereas some philosophers will want to say this indicates that emotional experiences purport to represent mind-independent moral properties, they claim that this can be explained in ways that do not imply any realist purport. This argument doesn't aim to undermine a Shaftesburian brand of sentimentalism, but if correct, it would mean that moral psychology doesn't directly favor this view; moral psychology would be neutral on the question of whether emotions involve presentations of objective moral properties.

As I mentioned above, the volume includes a pair of articles on reactive attitudes, both of which are very good. In "Reactive Attitudes and Second-Personal Address," Mason sets out to defend a unified conception of reactive attitudes. Such attitudes include resentment, indignation, remorse, gratitude, and forgiveness, among others, which are distinctive in that they are agent-oriented rather than proposition-oriented. Traditionally, the literature here has focused on the negative reactive sentiments. R. Jay Wallace and Stephen Darwall argue that sentiments such as resentment and indignation purport to register conclusive moral reasons and make a demand of the targeted agent. Mason sees value in this analysis, but she observes that it leaves out gratitude, forgiveness, and other attitudes which do not make deontic demands. For Mason, what unifies the reactive attitudes as a class is that they appeal to the target to live up to some ideal, one grounded in a relationship between agents. For example, a sister may feel gratitude toward her typically forgetful brother who sends her a birthday card and flowers. He has managed to live up to an ideal of their sibling relation, but it is not true that he has fulfilled a demand. In general, Mason persuasively identifies an important conceptual space between third-personal sentiments (e.g., admiring a beautiful painting) and imperatival, deontic sentiments (e.g., anger at someone for lying.)

Kauppinen's "Sentimentalism, Blameworthiness, and Wrongdoing" is also about reactive attitudes but addresses a very different question. He considers the prospects for an ambitious sentimentalism. It is one thing to argue, say, that x is admirable just in case it is fitting to admire x. But it is much less clear that wrongness (or permissibility, etc.) can be analyzed in terms of some fitting emotion. The most familiar efforts to do so appeal to blame: an act is wrong just in case it is fitting to blame the actor. But the trouble is that a person can be blameworthy for doing what is permissible. For example, in a variation of the basic trolley scenario, the bystander diverts the trolley away from the five and towards the one, which is permissible, but we add the following twist: they do so in part because they have a grudge against the one. Their bad quality of will makes them blameworthy, even though the act of diverting is permissible. Kauppinen's clever solution to this puzzle is to deny that wrongness concerns the actual quality of the actor's will. The idea is that an act is permissible if an agent who is rational and aware of all relevant information could perform the act blamelessly. But if it is impossible to perform an action blamelessly, then the act is wrong. While this indirect blame-wrongness link is more complicated, it allows sentimentalists to combine their theory with the possibility of agents who are to blame despite doing what is ethically permissible.

Another cluster of articles focus on empathy. Meyers's "A Modest Feminist Sentimentalism: Empathy and Moral Understanding Across Social Difference" stands out here. She focuses on the problem of difference, which is an epistemological challenge internal to feminism. A traditional aim of feminism is to achieve solidarity in confronting oppression. But women who are differently situated with respect to race, class, sexuality, and other markers of oppression have vastly different experiences that make achieving solidarity difficult. As Meyers summarizes, Audre Lorde famously illustrates this in her defense of the chasms existing between African American women and white middle-class feminists, and in her anger at the latter's tendency to lump all women together. Meyers argues that "empathy is a condition for the possibility of solidarity among diverse women" (211). This is a tempting argument to make, since empathy seems to be a source of insight into the psychology of others; but it is also a difficult argument, since empathy seems to work better to the extent that we are already similar to those with whom we are attempting to empathize.

For Meyers, empathy is an imaginative exercise that attempts to understand another person from a first-personal perspective. Specifically, it involves an effort to reproduce another's "subjective experience, including its cognitive, affective, corporeal, and desiderative dimensions" (221). It is not morally neutral. Cold-blooded bounty-hunters might "empathize" with those they hunt, but they do not empathize in the fullest sense. For Meyers, empathy involves seeing the humanity of the other. But it does not go so far as entailing a desire to act on their behalf. Empathy is useful in that it can be a way to experience values that one cannot easily recognize by thinking about someone third-personally. Such efforts can trigger "moral questioning and reconsideration" (223) of previous moral assumptions.

Meyers makes a strong case for turning Sally Scholz's account of the relationship between solidarity and empathy on its head. Whereas Scholz argues that empathy follows from solidarity, Meyers makes a strong case that it is a precondition of solidarity. This is because we need more than civility and respect to achieve genuine solidarity. She also does an admirable job parrying Peter Goldie's and Prinz's objections to empathy. One move she makes here is structurally similar to her reply to Scholz: whereas Prinz maintains that sympathetic concern is independent of empathy, Meyers contends that sympathy, especially across differences, requires empathy to initiate. In the end, Meyers situates empathy at the center of an important moral nexus, and I hope that her central claims receive attention going forward.

Debes's "The Authority of Empathy (Or, How to Ground Sentimentalism)" aims to illuminate what he calls empathic judgments. When we listen to another person's story we may come to feel as they feel, and on the basis of the same reasons. When this happens, it is not merely that another's emotions come to be intelligible to us but that we actually come to accept their reasons as ours (176). We may not unequivocally endorse the emotional response - perhaps, for example, the person really shouldn't have been enraged just because their parking spot was stolen. But we cannot unequivocally condemn their emotional response either, for we have been emotionally absorbed in the same way by the same narrative. Such empathic judgments involve a weak form of approbation that excuses the target from blame but without necessarily vindicating what they have done (178). Furthermore, Debes offers an intriguing argument that such exercises assume that people have affective dignity: being a person isn't just a function of being a rational agent, but also of being an affective one (190). We each have unique emotional perspectives that demand respect from others. Respecting others' emotional dignity involves such efforts to empathize (188).

Debes's contribution is provocative, but it is worth noting that whether there is a strong, constitutive connection between empathy and a certain sort of approval, or sanction, may depend on background commitments about the nature of emotion. According to Debes, in empathizing on the basis of a narrative explanation we accept the narrator's reasons to feel as "in some sense "our own."' And this is "Because we feel the very same emotion on the same grounds" (176). But if emotions aren't intentional, as some argue, then it is not clear why empathy would imply any evaluative commitments, even of a weak sort. But suppose emotions do involve an evaluation. A common view nowadays is that emotions are akin to normative perceptions. But perceptual theories are often motivated by the thought that we often wholly disavow our emotions (so-called recalcitrant emotions). This would seem not to fit Debes's view that "in virtue of empathizing you constitutively concede some normative space for my explanation of how I feel" (175, my emphasis). It seems to me, then, that Debes's argument works best given a view--not popular today--on which emotions constitutively involve (or just are) a type of normative judgment, whereby we take the label empathic judgment quite seriously. One may be tempted to say that empathy only causes empathic judgments. But if empathy and empathic judgments are distinct existences, then I'm not sure to what extent the article has to do with empathy, after all, as opposed to judgments with a certain, weaker normative content. It seems to me, then, that a deeper engagement with the philosophy of emotion could help to clarify Debes's interesting arguments.

This observation about the significance of the philosophy of emotions brings us to the final article. In "Whither Sentimentalism? On Fear, the Fearsome, and the Dangerous," D'Arms and Jacobson answer their titular question with a plea for a deeper engagement with the philosophy of emotion, including that of specific emotions. As they see it, it matters a great deal whether our emotions (or corresponding emotional concepts) must be analyzed in terms of values. If fear, say, is analyzed in terms of a judgment or perception of its object as dangerous, and if the dangerous is a non-sentimental value, then we might worry that sentimental values like fearsomeness do not much matter. They ultimately argue that we cannot characterize concepts such as the dangerous without reference to appropriate fear, despite how things might initially appear. Whatever readers decide about the merits of this argument, it certainly deserves attention. D'Arms and Jacobson's contribution, and their plea for a serious engagement with emotion, is a fitting end to this rich volume.


Thanks to Keren Gorodeisky for helpful comments.


Irwin, Terence (2008). The Development of Ethics: Volume 2: From Suarez and Rousseau. Oxford University Press.

Milona, Michael (2017). "Intellect versus Affect: Finding Leverage in an Old Debate," Philosophical Studies 174 (9): 2251-2276.

Oddie, Graham (2005). Value, Reality, and Desire. Oxford University Press.

Scheler, Max (1973). Formalism in Ethics and Non-Formal Ethics of Values. tr. Manfred Frings and Roger Frunk. Northwestern University Press.